Thinking about Reasons: Themes from the Philosophy of Jonathan Dancy

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David Bakhurst, Brad Hooker, and Margaret Olivia Little (eds.), Thinking about Reasons: Themes from the Philosophy of Jonathan Dancy, Oxford University Press, 2013, 349pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199604678.

Reviewed by Johannes Roessler, University of Warwick


This volume comprises fourteen essays about issues from Jonathan Dancy's writings on practical reasons. The essays throw into relief the importance and originality of Dancy's work on an interconnected set of issues, including the explanatory role of practical reasons, the distinction between 'enticing' and 'peremptory' reasons, moral particularism, buck-passing accounts of goodness and/or rightness, and the existence of irreducibly normative properties. It is of course disappointing that the collection is not crowned by a set of replies from Dancy, but to an extent this is compensated for by, on the one hand, Dancy's autobiographical-philosophical Afterword and, on the other, his strong presence as an interlocutor in almost all of the contributions to the collection. This volume is a fitting tribute to Dancy not just because it's a collection of excellent essays on a topic he describes as the main focus of his career, or because many of the chapters carefully and interestingly engage with Dancy's (in his phrase) iconoclastic positions on a number of issues, but also insofar as the collection follows Dancy's work in spanning traditional boundaries between the various philosophical disciplines that take an interest in practical reasons: the philosophy of mind/action, moral philosophy, and meta-ethics.

I won't attempt to summarize each of the chapters here. (For a helpful synopsis, see Brad Hooker's Introduction.) Instead I'll try to bring out some interconnections amongst some of them (and amongst some of the issues they tackle). I take the explanatory role of reasons as my starting point.

Here is an example of what might be called a naïve action explanation:

(1)  Henry is taking an umbrella because it is raining.

Philosophical orthodoxy -- in particular, the so-called 'standard story of action' expounded and defended by Michael Smith in chapter 3, 'The Ideal of Orthonomous Action, or the How and Why of Buck-Passing ' -- is apt to find this puzzling. It will insist that the correct way to make Henry's action intelligible as an intentional action is to give a mentalistic explanation, citing some of Henry's propositional attitudes. Dancy disagrees. That it is raining can be (part of) a good reason to take an umbrella; and it may be (part of) the reason for which Henry is acting. So it should be unsurprising that we can render his action intelligible by citing the reason-giving fact. On Dancy's view, however, our explanation is not quite as naïve as (1) might lead us to think. For Dancy accepts

Explanatory Monism: there is a single explanatory schema in terms of which intentional actions are explained as such.

Then, given that our explanatory schema has to cover 'bad' as well as 'good' cases (cases in which the agent really does have a good reason for the action as well as cases in which she acts under some misapprehension), the actual rain should not be seen as an explanatorily relevant factor. The way to accommodate this without reverting to the orthodox view, according to Dancy, is to acknowledge that rational explanations are non-factive. A more perspicuous representation of the explanation gestured at by (1) is

(2)  Henry's reason for taking an umbrella is that it is raining.

which, Dancy contends, is consistent with

(3)  But it's not in fact raining.

On Dancy's view, (1) turns out to be at least misleading, given that 'p because q' is naturally understood as factive. (It can be true only if both p and q are true.) Naïve action explanations don't reveal the underlying explanatory structure: they illustrate the point that 'there are factive ways of giving an explanation which, in its own nature, is non-factive'. (2011, p. 7) (Oddly, non-factivism is glossed over in Hooker's summary of Dancy's view, as 'the view that what explains intentional action are not the agent's beliefs or desires, but the facts that are the reasons for which the agent acts.' (p. 1).)

The trouble is that few philosophers find non-factivism palatable. (The view 'stands in provocative contrast to the standard outlook', as Constantine Sandis puts it. (p. 31)) In chapters 1 and 2, John McDowell ('Acting in the Light of a Fact') and Sandis ('Can Action Explanations Ever Be Non-Factive') offer different diagnoses of what's gone wrong. Importantly, neither wishes to restore orthodoxy. On the contrary, they both argue that non-factivism reflects Dancy's failure to free himself fully from the grip of certain aspects of the orthodox view.

According to Sandis, the problem lies in Dancy's acceptance of traditional

Agentialism: agential reasons are capable of explaining action. (p. 32)

An 'agential reason' is a practical reason for which someone acts. Sandis argues that it's a mistake to think of practical reasons themselves as explanantia of rational explanations. Rather we explain intentional actions 'by citing one or more agential reasons, thereby implying strictly that (a) the agent took p and/or q to count in favour of her action and (b) acted accordingly.' (36-7)

According to McDowell, the problem lies in Dancy's acceptance of traditional Explanatory Monism. Given the possibility of 'bad' cases (cases where someone acts under a misapprehension), this means that the form of our explanation must not be affected by whether or not the agent is right about things. Dancy's non-factivism is an attempt to respect this without rendering rational explanation mentalistic. McDowell seems to grant the coherence of non-factivism, but insists that non-factive rational explanations are silent on something 'we ought to want to know' insofar as we are trying to make rational sense of an action, viz. whether 'the action can be understood as a rational response to the fact in question'. (p. 19) On McDowell's view, (1) can be literally true, and there is nothing misleading about it; but it would be misleading to characterize it as an example of a non-mentalistic explanation. For (following Hyman (1999) and especially Hornsby (2009)) he argues that at least insofar as (1) is a rational explanation of an intentional action, it commits to

(4)  Henry is taking an umbrella because he knows it is raining.

At this point three questions arise:

  • Should we side with Dancy/Sandis in accepting Explanatory Monism?
  • Should we side with Dancy/McDowell in accepting Agentialism?
  • Should we side with McDowell/Sandis in rejecting Non-factivism (at least as a general account of rational explanation)?

It is far from obvious how to begin to make progress with these issues. Dancy's preferred method is to analyze certain 'explanatory locutions' (McDowell's phrase, p. 18), such as, most importantly, 'the agent's reason'. The trouble is that this tends to lead quickly to inconclusive bickering over which kinds of explanatory statements should be treated as canonical, and in any case, as Joseph Raz has emphasized, ordinary talk about reasons tends to be versatile and context-dependent. (Raz 2011, p. 3) McDowell argues that 'the idea of acting in the light of the fact', understood in the way he recommends, 'is completely natural, not a mere creature of philosophical theorizing' (p. 28). That seems right inasmuch as explanations invoking knowledge of reason-giving facts are a staple of commonsense psychology. But of course Dancy will argue that philosophical theorizing should lead us to treat ordinary explanatory practice with a measure of suspicion.

A more decisive consideration hinted at by McDowell has to do with the nature of the explanatory connection we invoke when we make actions rationally intelligible. McDowell makes the following

Dependence claim: the kind of intelligibility that is distinctive of 'good' cases 'is prior in the order of understanding' to the kind of intelligibility available in both 'good' and 'bad' cases. (p. 26)

McDowell pursues some parallels between this claim and a 'disjunctive' approach to perceptual experience, but he also notes some significant disanalogies (e.g., that a disjunctive analysis of rational explanation need, and should, not invoke the idea of 'subjective indistinguishability'). The Dependence claim entails, but goes beyond, the rejection of Explanatory Monism. It not only holds that 'good' cases are open to a distinctive kind of rational explanation, but in addition affirms the primacy of the 'good case'. One way to understand the first half of the claim (I'll come back to the second half) is that in a 'good' case, the explanatory relation we invoke is underpinned by the following normative relation. There is some (undefeated) consideration (i.e., fact) that counts in favour of the agent's doing what she is doing. That is precisely why she is doing it.

On this view, normative practical reasons turn out to be more closely implicated in rational explanation than the orthodox view (or indeed Dancy's non-factivism) allows. This would make it unsurprising that it can be illuminating, when debating the nature of practical reasons, to reflect on their explanatory role. Margaret Olivia Little adopts just that procedure in chapter 6 ('In Defence of Non-Deontic Reasons'). Her target is the view that practical reasons are by their nature deontic or (in Dancy's phrase) 'peremptory'. If you have a normative reason to do A, on this view, it will be wrong (for example, irrational) for you not to do A, unless you have some counterveiling justification. Little's main point is that this view is unable to make sense of 'broad swathes of paradigmatic agency'. You may go to the movies because doing so would be fun, and your reason renders your action 'robustly intelligible' (specifically: 'normatively intelligible'). But it would be mad to claim that you need a justification for declining to act on that reason. (The claim would be reminiscent of the doctrine I once heard a Hegelian pronounce, that one has a duty to take regular holidays.) What intelligibility requires is not that it would have been wrong to do anything else but that the action should be 'reasonable -- that is, consistent with what a well-functioning agent could choose.' (119)

Defenders of the 'standard story' will argue that the wrong-making norms at work when we make actions 'normatively intelligible' are not far to seek. The story, in what Smith takes to be its most promising version, says that there is a norm of instrumental rationality, and that in making sense of intentional actions we think of agents as exercising the capacity to conform their beliefs and intentions to that norm. (p. 52) The idea that there are 'requirements of rationality' receives more sustained attention in John's Broome's 'Practical Reasoning and Inference' (chapter 13). In a striking passage, he puts the idea as follows:

The law requires you to pay your taxes; convention requires you to use your right hand for shaking hands; morality requires you to be kind to strangers, and so on. Rationality also makes requirements of you. Its requirements are to do with good order among your mental attitudes. (p. 293)

From Little's perspective, the question is whether the putative requirements of rationality can make her going to the movies normatively intelligible. Her being a good citizen of the land of rationality might be thought to help to explain why, having decided to go to the movies, she leaves the house; but it hardly makes her choice to go to the movies itself intelligible. Of course the question is whether we need a reason-giving explanation of that choice to find her action normatively intelligible. On the other hand, one might question whether even her action can be rendered properly intelligible by invoking the norms of rationality. Certainly for the agent herself, the intelligibility-conferring point of leaving the house is provided by the prospective pleasure, not by the requirement to maintain order among her attitudes. The apparent advantage of explanations in terms of rational requirements is that they are neutral on whether the agent is right about the reason-providing features of her situation. But as McDowell's chapter makes clear, to think of this as an advantage is to make a substantive claim. The rival view is that the neutral type of explanation is 'posterior in the order of understanding' -- though admittedly, defenders of this rival view need to say more than McDowell does about the nature of the dependence between the two kinds of intelligibility.

Little presents her defence of non-deontic reasons as a development of Dancy's account of 'enticing' reasons, but it's not entirely clear how far her agreement with Dancy goes. In particular, it's not clear whether she embraces what R. Jay Wallace (in chapter 7, 'The Deontic Structure of Morality') describes as 'the fragmentation of practical reason that is implicit in Dancy's approach'. (p. 142) What Wallace is worried about is the idea that understanding the different natures of 'enticing' and 'peremptory' reasons requires distinguishing two types of practical reasoning, or two questions that may define the objective of practical reasoning. Such reasoning may be aimed at answering the question 'what shall I do?' (in which case it may invoke enticing reasons) or the question 'what is the thing to do?' (in which case it needs to invoke peremptory reasons). (See Dancy 2004) I won't attempt the difficult task of explicating the work the distinction is doing for Dancy, nor the problem Wallace sees with it. Suffice it to say that there is an interesting disagreement over what should be seen as our problem in this area. Dancy (and Little) take the philosophical challenge to be that of showing that the idea of a merely enticing reason is not, as one might have expected, mysterious or incoherent. They grant that deontic reasons are in an important sense paradigmatic practical reasons. Their objective is to show that this class of reasons does not exhaust the reasons we have. In Wallace's discussion, it is deontic reasons that are seen as standing in need of demystification. Given that practical reasons are not by their very nature peremptory, how is it that certain considerations 'enter the deliberative field . . . in the modality of requirements' (p. 149)? Wallace's interest, in particular, is in how this status is to be explained in the case of moral considerations.

The issue is complicated by the fact that not all deontic reasons are moral (compare reasons to do with 'our deepest personal projects and ambitions' (p. 147)) and that moral reasons are not invariably deontic (or else supererogation would be impossible). Still, Wallace thinks that deontic structure has a distinctive explanation in the moral case. Briefly, we should understand the claim deontic moral reasons make on us in terms of the valid claims that other people are in a position to make on us. Deontic moral reasons are 'constitutively implicated in complexes of relational (or 'bipolar') normativity'. (p. 153) While this line of argument seems important and suggestive, there is some unclarity over the explanatory role Wallace assigns to 'relational' normativity. Initially, the suggestion appears to be that the moral case is distinctive in that the peremptory character of a moral consideration cannot adequately be explained 'merely' in terms of the 'systematic importance' of the values the consideration reflects. The latter type of explanation may be appropriate, for example, in the case of reasons flowing from 'our deepest projects' -- but not in the case of morality. Yet the explanation he goes on to outline is naturally read precisely as a way to fill out what gives moral considerations their distinctive ''systematic importance'. For it is the distinctive value of relationships of certain kinds that is said to provide 'the key to understanding the reason-giving force of morality'. (p. 162)

Wallace's discussion of relational normativity is usefully read alongside Stephen Darwall's 'Morality and Principle' (chapter 6), the aim of which is to show that moral particularism is incompatible with the 'second-personal character of moral accountability'. (p. 182) Moral particularism (and reason holism) is also illuminatingly discussed in the chapters by David Bakhurst, A. W. Price, David McNaughton and Piers Rawling, and Sean McKeever and Michael Ridge. The collection contains three further essays, all concerned to repulse Dancy's objections to the author's views: Philip Stratton-Lake probes Dancy's concerns about the buck-passing account of goodness, Roger Crisp defends normative egoism and consequentialism, and Bart Streumer attempts to strengthen the case against the existence of irreducibly normative properties.


Dancy, J. 2004: 'Enticing Reasons', in R.J. Wallace et al., Reason and Value: Themes from the Moral Philosophy of Joseph Raz. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

-- 2011: 'Acting in Ignorance', Frontiers of Philosophy in China 6, 345-57.

Hornsby, J. 2008: 'A Disjunctive Conception of Acting for Reasons', in A. Haddock and F. Macpherson (eds.), Disjunctivism. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Raz, J. 2011: From Normativity to Responsibility. Oxford: Oxford University Press.