Thinking about Things

Placeholder book cover

Mark Sainsbury, Thinking about Things, Oxford University Press, 2018, 199pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198803348.

Reviewed by Tim Crane, Central European University


This is the second of Mark Sainsbury's books to have a unicorn on its cover. The paperback edition of Reference without Referents (a neglected classic in my opinion) was the first. The image indicates a common concern in the two books: how to account for the representation of the non-existent within a theory of representation. Reference without Referents (a title that is easier to read than to pronounce) presented a theory of linguistic reference for all noun phrases -- singular, plural, quantified, demonstrative -- which built the possibility of reference failure into the basic structure of the theory. Rather than a referring term being associated by a semantic theory with its referent, it is associated with a reference condition -- the condition that the world has to meet in order for it to have a referent.

Reference without Referents (2005) presented a genuine alternative to the usual back-and-forth between description theories of singular reference and direct reference theories. What is more, it set this alternative within a general and comprehensive theory of reference for all noun phrases. It is disappointing -- and a bit of a mystery to me -- that this book was not more widely taken up in the philosophy of language. Perhaps one reason for this was the Davidsonian truth-theoretic semantic framework in which Sainsbury set his ideas, which (for better or worse) has now become somewhat outdated.

The latest book shares some of the commitments of the earlier book. Although it announces itself as being concerned with the general question of how thought is possible, the new book's aims are actually more limited. There are really two: to propose a new theory of attitude attributions, which Sainsbury calls the 'display theory'; and to argue for the non-relationality of thinking or intentionality. One of these aims would be enough for one book; to get two in one book, from a philosopher of Sainsbury's creativity and originality, is a bonus.

First, then, the display theory. Sainsbury's theory is that when we attribute an attitude to a subject we put the concepts involved in the attribution on 'display', and 'the attribution is correct if the concepts displayed match those in the mind of the subject' (p.1). Displaying a concept is not the same as quoting a word, since one can quote without understanding the words quoted, yet displaying concepts in an attitude attribution requires that we understand them. But nor is it using the concepts in the way we would outside of attitude attributions. If I say that my pet unicorn is coming to dinner, I am using the concept in the normal way, entailing (for example) that I have a pet unicorn. But if I say that Arabella hopes that her pet unicorn is coming to dinner, that carries no such entailment. In attributing this hope to Arabella, I display the concept unicorn, and in doing so I attempt to characterise how things are in her mind.

Sainsbury's theory is distinctive among theories of attitude attributions in at least two ways. First, it does not just deal with propositional attitude attributions, but also those attitudes attributed by psychological intensional transitive verbs ('imagines', 'fears' etc.). And second, it gives a unified account of attributions in what is variously called the 'transparent', 'de re', 'exported' (etc.) style, as well as in the usual intensional style. None of these labels is exactly accurate, and there is no one syntactic marker for them, but the phenomenon is familiar: sometimes we describe people's attitudes using concepts that they themselves would not use, in order to draw attention to distinctive aspects of their situation. So while a standard intensional attribution might attribute truly to Oedipus the belief that Jocasta is not his mother, and the desire to marry Jocasta, we can also say truly that Oedipus wanted to marry his mother. As Sainsbury says, attitude attributions are 'at the vortex of potentially conflicting demands': at the centre there is 'the demand for fidelity to the subject's state' but there is also the need (e.g.) to describe the attitude in terms of ways the subject is actually related to the world, whether they are aware of these relations or not (pp.73-4). How does Sainsbury's theory resolve this tension?

The central idea is that the concepts displayed in an attribution of an attitude must be appropriately related to those in the mind of the subject if the attitude is to be true. At its simplest, there will be an identity between these concepts; but the 'de re' (etc.) cases require a more complex account: 'Exact match between displayed conceptual structure and a structure exercised by the subject is required, except when the attributor's concepts are used de re, in which case the requirement is sameness of reference' (p.74). So my attribution to Oedipus of the belief that Jocasta is not his mother is correct because these concepts are the concepts that he himself exercises, and he does not take them to be co-referential; but my 'de re' attribution of the desire to marry his mother is also correct (partly) because the conceptual structure 'his mother' is co-referential with the concept 'Jocasta'. The two conceptual structures (in the display and in the subject's own mind) must also be isomorphic, of the same conceptual type, and the subject must be related to the concept by an appropriate psychological relation reported in the display.

Sainsbury develops this general idea across a wide variety of cases, including the familiar problem cases (failure of substitution, non-existence, lack of specificity, etc.) and gives illuminating accounts of attributions of indexical attitudes. In all these cases Sainsbury shows his characteristic good sense and flexibility about what it makes sense to say, and an honesty about how much he thinks he has actually achieved.

Sainsbury's second main theme is the non-relational character of intentionality: that is, the things we think about need not exist, and therefore we are not related to them. His display theory makes clear how you can attribute an attitude without committing yourself to the existence of the things you are talking about. He quite rightly maintains, as he did in Reference without Referents, that there are no conceptual difficulties with the idea of a concept for something which does not exist -- indeed it ought to be a presupposition of any theory of concepts that this can arise. Perhaps more controversially, he also explains how we should understand the phrase 'something that does not exist' without committing ourselves to a contradiction.

Since Quine's influential writings on this topic, the problems of non-existence have often been discussed in terms of the interpretation of the ordinary language quantifier 'something' and its supposed logical representation 'Ǝ'. Chapter 2 is a very nice treatment of this topic, to a large extent independent of the display theory. This chapter should serve as a stand-alone corrective to the still widespread view that 'Ǝ' in its usual understanding represents the logic or semantics of the English word 'something', and that ontological commitments should be expressed fundamentally in terms of quantifiers like 'something'.[1] As A.N. Prior pointed out long ago, 'Ǝ' can only bind variables in name position, but 'something' can bind many positions including adjectival positions ('You are something I am not -- kind'). Sainsbury gives an elegant substitutional interpretation of 'something', from which it follows that its role cannot be to express ontological commitment. He effectively rebuts familiar arguments against substitutional quantification, and argues that no more ontological commitment is expressed by quantification than is present in what he calls the 'vindicating instances' of the quantified sentence. His claim is only about 'something'; he does not claim that substitutional quantification is fundamental, or even that all natural language quantification is substitutional.

In the course of defending his account of 'something' Sainsbury makes a distinction between 'there are things that don't exist' and 'there are objects that are non-existent' (pp.19, 61). The first he thinks is true, the second false. Sainsbury has his reasons for making the distinction, but it is hard to hear the difference unless one accepts his way of regulating the meanings of the words 'thing' and 'object'. Sainsbury himself has a well-motivated metaphysical account of objects (pp.48-9), and it is perhaps this which explains his opposition to talk of non-existent objects and intentional objects: 'we don't have to believe in a metaphysical category of "intentional objects", some of which are non-existent' (p.61).

It is very common for philosophers of language who talk about non-existence to dismiss such non-existent intentional objects, conceived as having a 'lower-class ontological status, a sort of being shy of existence' (in Nathan Salmon's words).[2] But who actually believes in such things? Like many philosophers, Sainsbury attributes the view to Franz Brentano's student Alexius Meinong (1853-1920). He talks about Meinong's 'opinion that there is a genuine ontological category of intentional objects' (p.30), and he argues that 'the vast edifice of "object theory" (Gegenstandstheorie) is based on a mistake' (p.19). Gegenstandstheorie is Meinong's name for his theory of objects of thought. Meinong assumed that we could think about things that have no being, but it is common to take him as treating these things as if they were entities of some kind, i.e. as if they had some kind of quasi-being or quasi-existence. For this reason Gilbert Ryle called him 'the supreme entity multiplier in the history of philosophy'.[3]

But this is not Meinong's actual view, nor is it the view of any real, existing Meinongian. Meinong distinguishes quite clearly between Gegenstandstheorie and metaphysics. At the very beginning of his most-cited work, he writes that 'metaphysics has to do with everything that exists. However, the totality of what exists, including what has existed and will exist, is infinitely small in comparison with the totality of the Objects of knowledge'.[4] Beings fall into two kinds: those which have spatiotemporal being (existence), and those which have non-spatiotemporal being (subsistence). This is not an obscure distinction: it would be accepted in different terminology by any philosopher today who accepts that there are concrete as well as abstract objects, in the usual understanding of those terms. Ontology, as the theory of being, encompasses existing and subsisting objects. But in addition to existent and subsistent objects, there are also objects with no being whatsoever. These objects, like the round square and the golden mountain, are what we might call 'mere' objects of thought. The point of Meinong's Gegenstandstheorie was that we could study objects 'as such', and predicate things of them independently of whether they have being -- this is his famous principle of the independence of Sein (Being) from Sosein (Being-so, i.e. having properties). This is why the theory of objects is not ontology. So the category of an intentional object -- an object of thought -- is not an ontological category.[5]

Some may prefer not to talk about non-existent objects at all. But they should not respond to those who do -- like Graham Priest, Richard Routley and others, including me -- by saying that 'non-existent object' must name some peculiar quasi-ontological or metaphysical category, and then scratch their heads wondering what this might be. At a bare minimum, to say that there are non-existent objects of thought is just another way of saying that we can talk and think about things (or objects) that don't exist. (Most contemporary Meinongians like Priest and Routley make no distinction between being and existence.) And Sainsbury accepts that we can think and talk about the non-existent -- indeed, he is one of the philosophers of language today who has made the most progress in understanding this. So he would do better to express his view by saying: 'I restrict the word "object" to existing things of a certain metaphysical kind. But others use the word as I use the word "thing". Translated into my terminology, an "intentional object" is a thing which is thought about. And some of these things do not exist'.

There is a certain irony in the fact that the only significant philosopher who defended the view that all objects of thought have being of some kind or another was Bertrand Russell, sometimes promoted as the philosopher who liberated the theory of reference from Meinongian obscurities. In 1903 Russell wrote that 'Being is that which belongs to every conceivable term, to every possible object of thought'.[6] Although he quickly dropped this view, Russell much later attributed it to Meinong, having apparently forgotten what Meinong's actual position was (he had written about Meinong in some papers published in Mind in the early 1900s).[7] But the attribution of this view to Meinong has stuck, perhaps thanks to Russell, Quine, Ryle and others. Its persistence has made it difficult for philosophers to be listened to when they say that there are non-existent intentional objects, since their critics inevitably hear these words as expressing the view that there are objects which do not exist and yet have some kind of peculiar 'being shy of existence'. But this is position is a straw man.

The main achievements of Sainsbury's important book, it seems to me, are the display theory and the account of 'something', and the subtlety and care with which he defends them. His defence of these ideas does not need to mention the pseudo-Meinongian straw man. Nor does the defence of the non-relationality of intentionality, since all that really amounts to is the fact that we can think about things that do not exist -- an idea which should not really be controversial.


Thanks to Alex Grzankowski for his very helpful comments on an earlier draft of this review, and for discussions of this book.

[1] Sainsbury attributes to me the view that 'intuitive truths about "something" sentences reveal significant features of ontology' (p.30). This is not my view; I reject explicitly it in Chapter Two of The Objects of Thought (Oxford: Oxford University Press 2013); see e.g. pp.18, 47, 38.

[2] Nathan Salmon 'Nonexistence' Noûs 32: 277-319 (1998), p.288

[3] Gilbert Ryle, Oxford Magazine, October 26, 1933.

[4] 'On the Theory of Objects' translated by Isaac Levi, D. B. Terrell, and Roderick Chisholm in Roderick Chisholm (ed.) Realism and the Background of Phenomenology (Atascadero, CA: Ridgeview, 1981) p.79.

[5] Sainsbury also attributes to me the 'striking ontological conclusion' that there are nonexistent intentional objects, a view which he says 'does not follow from the claim that there are things that do not exist' (p.31). But in fact I explicitly deny that the acceptance of non-existent intentional objects is an ontological conclusion. On p.38 of The Objects of Thought I say that 'some objects of thought exist, and some do not' does not mean 'that there is an ontological or quasi-ontological category of "objects of thought" to which all these things belong'. And on p.95 I say that 'the conception of intentional objects defended in this book . . . involves no ontological commitment. My ontological commitments are all those things I take to be in the world. And what I mean by the world is reality, what exists, what has being. Non-existent intentional objects are no part of this.' I suspect Sainsbury's misreading of my position is due to him approaching 'Meinongian' views in the traditional way described above.

[6] Russell, Principles of Mathematics (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press 1903) p.427

[7] Russell, My Philosophical Development (London: George Allen and Unwin 1959) p.64