Thinking and Being

Thinking And Being

Irad Kimhi, Thinking and Being, Harvard University Press, 2018, 166pp., $42.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674967892.

Reviewed by Jean-Philippe Narboux, Université Bordeaux Montaigne


1. Irad Kimhi's book is in my view one of the most important books in philosophy to have appeared of late. To set it in its proper context, it may help to begin with the following excerpt from a course by Wittgenstein:

Thinking, wishing, hoping, believing, and negation all have something in common. The same sort of puzzling questions can be asked about each. How can one wish for a thing that does not happen or hope that something will happen that does not? How can not-negate p, when may not be the case, i.e. when nothing corresponds to p? (Wittgenstein 1979: 110-111)

Whatever their maieutic merits, these formulations, which return us to what Kimhi calls "the gate of philosophy" (the Parmenidean puzzles), may appear to be muddled. To the contemporary philosopher, in effect, they are likely to seem to be running together a number of philosophical issues that Frege taught us it was imperative to keep apart. First, they may seem to conflate the problem of falsehood with the problem of negation. The phrase "to think what is not" is notoriously ambiguous between "to think what, in fact, is not" and "to think as not being". Construed in the former way (that is to say, de re) it captures the puzzle of falsehood. Construed in the latter way (that is to say, de dicto), it raises the puzzle of negation. Second, these formulations may seem to conflate negation, a truth-functional logical connective, with propositional attitudes like wishing and hoping, thereby obfuscating the difference between so-called "extensional" contexts and "intensional" ones. Third, they may seem to fail to separate the psychological from the logical, thereby suggesting that the laws governing the recognition of truth are continuous with the laws governing truth.

Once sorted out along these broadly Fregean lines, the puzzles indiscriminately raised by Wittgenstein prove to be readily amenable to Fregean solutions. Consider the puzzle of falsehood, as raised by Parmenides. A Fregean "thought" (Gedanke), insofar as it is the sense (Sinn) of an assertion (Aussage), is there to be thoughtwhether or not it is grasped or judged to be true by anyone, and whether or not it is in fact true. The asserted content of an assertion is distinct from its assertoric force. In order to beat all (i.e., to have the logical unity apart from which it would not exist in the first place), it need not be put forward as true, let alone be true. Thus, if what one says, in fact, is not, what one says still has being in a different sense, namely the being of a thought. On this standard Fregean account (whether it is actually Frege's or not), to think is to stand in a certain relation to such a being. In a different tradition, one would find the notion of "intentional being" invoked at this juncture.

2. Did Wittgenstein blunder then? Kimhi suggests otherwise. Consider such ordinary patterns of inference as the following:

A believes p.

A believes p.

A believes p.



A's belief is correct.

So A's belief is correct.

So A's belief is incorrect.

So p.

Kimhi calls the logical patterns belonging in this group the "syllogisms of thinking and being" (10, 111, 122-123). He contends that the defining task of "philosophical logic" is to entitle ourselves to their obvious validity (10). This requires recognizing the same proposition as occurring both in "extensional contexts" like "not-p", in which it occurs asserted, and in "intensional contexts" like "A believes not-p", in which it occurs unasserted. Frege's account of indirect discourse seems to make this well nigh impossible. For on his account, "p" changes significance according to whether it occurs outside or inside the intensional context of indirect discourse (12, 123). Thus, "from a Fregean point of view, the premises of these syllogisms are logically unconnected." (123)

It is also not so clear, on a closer look, that a conception of thought and judgment along Fregean lines is able to dispose of the Parmenidean puzzle. Judgeable content is introduced as the highest common factor shared by thought and judgment. One can grasp a judgeable content without yet taking the further step of judging it to be true or false ("advancing to a truth-value"). Judgment is logically more complex than thought: it consists in a content grasped plus the recognition of the truth of what is thus grasped. This means that the logical unity of the content of an assertion, as conveyed by the predicative use of "is", precedes and is independent of the logical unity of the judgment to which this assertion gives expression, as conveyed by the assertoric use of "is" (8, 18). As Kimhi points out, however, it is far from clear that the notion of a judgeable content that is at once forceless and truth-apt is coherent. How can content show how things are if it is true prior to and independently of saying that they do so stand?

3. It begins to look as though the contemporary neglect of the old puzzles rehearsed by Wittgenstein is far less revelatory of the nature of these puzzles than of the current state of philosophy. The groundbreaking lesson of Kimhi's reflections is that this diagnosis may well be sound. Our sense that we have put these old puzzles behind us bespeaks a "misplaced confidence", one that "stems from our present conceptions of logic and language" (2). The task of addressing these puzzles must be confronted anew. Given that the Parmenidean account of the unity of thinking and being lands us in an aporia, what is required is a diagnosis of what stands in the way of an alternative account of this unity (8).

It is Kimhi's contention that the fundamental obstacle resides in the assumption that "All logical complexity is predicative or functional in nature" (15, 22), i.e., that every dimension of the logical complexity of a proposition can be rendered in function-argument form. Let us call this assumption the Uniformity Assumption (UA). This assumption, in turn, fuels the assumption that a simple proposition enjoys a unitary being, and so is individuated as the proposition that it is, prior to being true or false (39). On this assumption, the veridical being or non-being of what is said by a proposition (i.e., its being the case or not being the case) is extrinsic to its predicative being (i.e., the being expressed by the predicative use of "is") (8, 18). Let us call this assumption the Externality Assumption (EA). Correlatively, the veridical sense of being and non-being (i.e., being as being-true and being as being-false) is held to be at best secondary (69-70). Finally, EA induces a twofold thesis: it is countenanced (1) that every assertion articulates into two components, one of which conveys its semantical content and the other the force with which it is put forward (39); and (2) that the contexts in which a proposition can occur divide into two radically different kinds of contexts, namely, extensional, "transparent", truth-functional complexes, on the one hand, and intensional, "opaque", non-truth-functional complexes, on the other hand (12). Thus, UA is the ultimate source of the "psycho/logical dualism" (as the book calls it) that was systematically advocated by Frege and is nowadays more or less taken for granted (33-34). This dualistic view of judgment as decomposing into a subjective act and a truth-evaluable content drives a wedge between the psychological and ontological versions of the principle of non-contradiction (PPNC and OPNC respectively) (39). It is supposed to be the only way of steering clear of the pitfall of psychologism about logic (33).

This overall diagnosis is at once profound, original, and controversial. It defines the principal tasks of the book. The book argues that the force-content and intension-extension distinctions lead to a number of dead ends, as they render the main task of philosophical logic intractable. It traces these distinctions to EA and ultimately to UA. Under the name of "psycho-logical monism", it advances an alternative conception of logical complexity that is not committed to UA.

4. The book comprises a substantial introduction and three chapters. The chapters stand to each other as three concentric circles, three moments in a single spiraling development that culminates in an attempt to recover the insight contained in Parmenides's claim that "thinking and being are the same" (6, 152).

The first chapter inquires into the unity of the ontological and psychological guises of the principle of non-contradiction (i.e., OPNC and PPNC), the second chapter into the unity of its logical and psychological guises (i.e., LPPNC and PPNC), and the third chapter into the unity of its ontological and logical guises (i.e., OPNC and LPNC). The first chapter focuses upon the unity of force and content (the "life" of "p"), the second chapter upon the unity of the contradictory pair (i.e., the unity of "p" and "not-p"), and the third chapter upon the unity of thinking and being (i.e., the unity of thinking that and its being the case that p). Taken together, the three chapters deliver an understanding of the unity between all three guises of the principle of non-contradiction. In so doing, they bring into view the validity of the above patterns of inference.

5. The crucial clue to the availability of an alternative conception of logical complexity is afforded by the peculiar unity that pertains to the contradictory pair made up of "p" and "not-p". Accordingly, while the ultimate aim of the book is to secure the unity of thinking and being (i.e., the unity of thinking that and its being the case that p), its leading thread resides in an effort to secure the unity of the contradictory pair (i.e., the unity of "p" and "not-p"). The problem of the intelligibility of the unity of the contradictory pair functions as a touchstone.

Frege's claim that the assertoric force and the semantic content of a proposition must be dissociated from each other, often referred to as "Frege's Point" (FP), builds on the observation that, as Geach puts it, "a proposition may occur in discourse now asserted, now unasserted, and yet be recognizably the same proposition" (37). Thus, "p" must occur unasserted in "not-p" (since otherwise "not-p" would both deny and assert p), yet be recognizably the same in "not-p" as in "p" (since otherwise it would not be manifest that "not-p" is the contradictory of "p").

"Frege's Observation" (FO), as Kimhi calls it, seems to imply FP, i.e., the claim that "occurrences of the 'same' thought as unasserted and asserted 'have' a logical content in common, where what they thus 'have in common' is a highest factor". For it seems that if assertoric force belongs to p, then cannot occur unasserted in "not-p" or "if then q". Certainly, as long as EA is in place, FO implies FP.

While Kimhi does not dispute FO, he does dispute FP. He contends that it is a mistake to construe FO as FP, as Geach and virtually everyone after him have done (38). Far from being equivalent to FO, FP is unfaithful to it. In Kimhi's view, FP rests on the conflation of two distinct notions of occurrence, namely the actual, concrete occurrence of a propositional sign and the symbolic occurrence of a propositional sign within a larger logical context (38).

6. For the rejection of UA to be compelling, an alternative conception of logical complexity must be provided. It must be shown that, pace Frege, not all logical complexity is predicative or functional in character. To this aim, Kimhi invokes what he calls "the literal notion of the syncategorematic", distinguishing it from the familiar "semantic notion of the syncategorematic" (79). The traditional contrast between "categorematic" and "syncategorematic" expressions is hylemorphic: an expression counts as "syncategorematic" if it indicates how the proposition is composed (its form) rather than what enters in its composition (its matter) (79-80). The literal contrast is more demanding: an expression counts as "syncategorematic", in this stronger sense, if it cannot be a component of a predicative proposition at all (81), i.e., if it cannot be so much as a merely formal component of it (16).

A syncategorematic expression does not add anything (whether content or form) to the sense of any proposition embedded in it. On Kimhi's account, the assertions "Not-p", "A thinks p", "is true" and, last but not least, "p" itself, do not add anything whatsoever to the sense of "p". None of these expressions stands for a relation. In fact, none of them stands for anything. They all are syncategorematic expressions. That the assertion "p" is itself a syncategorematic unit becomes intelligible once it is realized that the propositional symbol "p" consists in a fact rather than a complex (100).

7. The rejection of UA is a cornerstone of Wittgenstein'sTractatus. In Frege's works, the analysis of propositions into subject and predicate was supplanted by their analysis into argument and function. However momentous this gesture may have been, when set against Wittgenstein's rejection of UA, it appears to be a tempest in a teapot.

Kimhi's distinction between categorematic complexity and syncategorematic complexity is a terminological variant on the Tractatus's distinction between functional complexity and operational complexity. The latter distinction captures what the early Wittgenstein called his "fundamental thought", namely, the thought that so-called "logical constants" do not represent anything (TLP 4.0312). An operation does not characterize the sense of the propositions in which it occurs at all. It does not so much as characterize the form of their sense (TLP 5.241, 5.25).

The idea that an operation designates strictly nothing-- that is to say, that it does not so much as inform a proposition in which it occurs -- is best conveyed by considering the operation of negation. Kimhi holds with Wittgenstein that one and the same reality corresponds to both "p" and "~p" (TLP 4.0621). It follows from this that to the negation sign "~" there corresponds strictly nothing in reality. On the view that Kimhi takes over from Wittgenstein, the operation of negation merely reverses the oriented use of the proposition that it takes as basis (61). In Kimhi's idiom, the difference between "p" and "~p" is merely syncategorematic (16, 19-20).

In construing negation as an operation, i.e., as something done, Wittgenstein directly impugns Frege's view of negation as forceless. Correlatively, in charging Frege's sign of assertion with being superfluous, Wittgenstein does not mean to suggest that their being assertions is inessential to propositions, but on the contrary that it is far too essential to them to be something that can be superadded as an extra ingredient. This criticism turns on the rejection of the force-content distinction, far from bespeaking a commitment to it (50-51).

According to the "Complete Context Principle", a simple propositional sign "p" does not have any sense apart from its ability to occur as well in "~p" and other propositional contexts (46, 48). Thus, even though "p" has priority over "~p", it depends for its sense on the prior logical unity of the larger whole consisting in the pair of "p" and "not-p". Conversely, the logical unity of this larger whole depends in turn on the repeatability of the propositional sign "p" (64-65). In other words, it is essential to logical activity to manifest itself in language. This "hermeneutical circle" (64, 75) constitutes the crux of "the Complete Linguistic Turn" (64) that we need to take.

8. Although the foregoing does little more than scratch the surface of Kimhi's remarkably rich book, it should be clear by now that this book places some of the most perennial problems of philosophy in a radically new light. Given its originality, the book can hardly be expected to be exempt from difficulties. I will end by mentioning one such difficulty. I single it out because it attaches to the status of the author's own discourse.

If, as Kimhi contends, "the judgment that not-simply reverses the syncategorematic direction displayed in p" (61) and logical principles, like "or not-p", are "tautologies" in the sense of "self-cancelling propositional displays" (66), then what are we to make of those ostensible assertions in which the author articulates his view of negation by setting it against what he regards as confusion? How are we to understand the use that they themselves make of negation in order to keep confusion at bay? Kimhi writes, for example: "The separation which is the negation of the verb is nota different combination, i.e. a different way of holding the terms . . ." (107, my emphasis; see also 115).

Ostensible assertions like this one do not seem to be tautologies in Kimhi's sense. Yet they are not bipolar. Like tautologies, they can only be true. They do not admit of an intelligible negation. What they reject, they do not seem to reject as false but as unintelligible. Since they do not admit of so much as a contrary negation, let alone a contradictory one, they are essentially asymmetric.

We seem to be faced with the following dilemma. If these ostensible assertions make sense -- and the book never so much as hints that they don't -- then the account that the book gives of negation is at best incomplete and at worse inconsistent. It is incomplete insofar as not every non-tautological ostensible assertion can be understood in terms of a two-way logical capacity, and insofar as the unity of the two uses of negation that figure in the book -- the use of negation that the book elucidates and the other use that the book is driven to make of it in its attempt to elucidate the former -- remains opaque. And this account of negation runs the risk of inconsistency to the extent that it cannot be formulated without undermining itself. If, on the other hand, the ostensible assertions under consideration ultimately make no sense at all, then what is missing is an account of what the author aims to achieve in advancing them at all -- what is more, without ever acknowledging their nonsensicality.

Perhaps Kimhi does not grant after all that ostensible assertions like the above ones differ from tautologies in his sense. He sometimes seems to hold that the very notion of a judgment without a contrary is incoherent, as all ostensible assertions divide without remainder into genuine, bipolar propositional symbols and tautologies. If so, however, the uniform conception of tautologies as self-cancelling displays cannot be retained. For their emptiness is nota matter of the self-cancelling recurrence of simple propositional symbols. Arguably, the problem reflected by the foregoing dilemma lies at the core of the puzzle of negation, of which the puzzle of the contradictory pair forms but one aspect. On the face of things, the book appears ill-equipped to address it.

Whether or not the problem ultimately can be handled from the perspective of Kimhi's book, his book certainly stands out as a profound philosophical inquiry that no philosopher can safely ignore. How much this book achieves in little more than one hundred fifty pages is confounding. It shows relational accounts of judgment and truth to be irremediably flawed. It dismantles conceptual dichotomies that have largely prevailed within contemporary analytic philosophy since its inception, such as the dichotomy between assertoric force and semantic content, or that between intensional and extensional contexts, or again that between the predicative and the veridical senses of "is". Perhaps its single most important contribution lies in the demonstration that we can and must make progress on all these fronts in a single stroke if we are to take the proper measure of the present tasks of philosophy.


Wittgenstein, Ludwig. 1921. Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus. English translation by D. Pears and B. McGuinness. London: Routledge, 1963.

Wittgenstein, Ludwig. 1979. Cambridge Lectures (1932-1935). Oxford: Blackwell.