Thinking Between Deleuze and Merleau-Ponty

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Judith Wambacq, Thinking Between Deleuze and Merleau-Ponty, Ohio University Press, 2017, 264pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780821422878.

Reviewed by Laura McMahon, Eastern Michigan University


Judith Wambacq’s book, which explores resonances between the philosophies of Maurice Merleau-Ponty and Gilles Deleuze, is thoughtful, well-researched, and a good resource for scholars interested in the philosophies of either or both Merleau-Ponty and Deleuze, and in the development of twentieth-century Continental philosophy more broadly. Though the philosophical projects of Merleau-Ponty and Deleuze are often sharply contrasted, Wambacq makes a convincing case that the differences between the two are more stylistic and matters of emphases than they are substantial and central, and argues that it is philosophically worthwhile to read Merleau-Ponty through a Deleuzian lens and Deleuze through a Merleau-Pontean lens. In what follows, I will (1) outline what I take to be Wambacq’s central thesis and argument; (2) provide a schematic outline of each of the book’s seven chapters; and (3) raise a concern regarding a tension between one of her central theses and the manner in which she at times engages with major figures in the history of philosophy.

Wambacq’s central thesis is that both Merleau-Ponty and Deleuze are engaged in transcendental projects that seek to articulate the conditions for thinking being or, rather, the conditions for how being comes articulate itself in thought. However, the conditions for the thinking of being are not located in a god or transcendental subject that exists somewhere “prior to being and time,” as Merleau-Ponty puts it in the Preface to Phenomenology of Perception (PP), but are immanent to being: the condition is immanent to that which it conditions (PP lxxiii). What does this mean?

Wambacq compellingly argues that we can understand the manner in which the condition is immanent to that which it conditions through a conception of expression that we can find at work in the philosophies of both Merleau-Ponty and Deleuze. In acts of original expression — the original expressions of art or philosophy being paradigmatic examples — it is not the case that there is a pre-existing “essence” that is subsequently represented in worldly things or “copies”. Rather, in original acts of expression the expressed comes to be only in and through the act of expression. To use an example from Wambacq’s Chapter Five, “the little phrase” in Proust’s Remembrance of Things Past — written about at length by both Merleau-Ponty and Deleuze — incarnates the essence of Swann’s love for Odette in a “circular relation” of expressed and expression (p. 152). The sense of Swann’s love grants a singular unity to the notes of the sonata, even as this love “is” nowhere but in the unfolding notes of the sonata, such that the notes can be seen to grant sense to the love even as the love can be seen to grant sense to the temporal arrangement of notes. In this way, the condition — the love — relies on the conditioned — the sonata — to give it body and form, even as it is not simply reducible to this particular arrangement of musical notes.

Grasping this immanent, circular relationship between the condition and the conditioned (or the ground and the grounded) gives us not only epistemological insight into what is going on in subjective acts of expression, but ontological insight into how being expresses itself in time. Broadly, Wambacq argues that the relationship of the invisible and the visible in Merleau-Ponty’s late work, and the relationship between the virtual and the actual in Deleuze’s early work, should be understood in terms of this immanent logic of expression, in which the condition — the invisible, the virtual — does not exist on a different plane than the conditioned — the visible, the actual — but rather, as Merleau-Ponty writes in The Visible and the Invisible (VI), at its joints (VI 116, quoted in Wambacq, p. 117). The main ontological point here, already at play in Merleau-Ponty’s late work on the “flesh” and more overtly and fully developed by Deleuze primarily in his early works, is that the unity of being only shows itself — and only is — in the manner in which it differentiates itself into a plethora of singular forms over time. The unity of being is only as difference, and is nowhere but in the joints of the different forms generated in and by it. In this light, the thinking of being is not the work of a transcendental subject; rather, being articulates itself in pre-individual expressive thought. To continue with Proust’s example of "the little phrase, “it is no longer the musician who plays the sonata but the sonata that realizes itself through the musician” (p. 153).

Chapter One, “The Arepresentational Conception of Thinking Thought in Merleau-Ponty and Deleuze,” lays important groundwork for the book’s overall argument. Here, Wambacq traces the distinction that can be found centrally at play in both Merleau-Ponty and Deleuze between non-original and original thinking. In both philosophers, non-original thinking is thought that merely represents a previously existing state of affairs. Original thought, by contrast, generates its own sense: rather than remaining within the bounds of common sense, sedimented meanings, it allows new singularities, and new problems, to come to the fore. This distinction has important implications for how we understand the relationship between thinking and being: in original thought, thinking — which we learn from Merleau-Ponty is rooted in perception and is in immersive, dialogical contact with things in the world — allows what is new and — as we see most prominently in Deleuze — discordant and shocking to emerge in contingent, historical circumstances, thus implying an understanding of truth that is not static and atemporal but a simultaneously conservative and creative making of sense in time.

Chapter Two, “Ontology in Merleau-Ponty and Deleuze,” is the most important chapter for the book’s overall argument. Here, Wambacq offers a systematic comparison between Merleau-Ponty’s “endo-ontology” of flesh in The Visible and the Invisible and of Deleuze’s ontology of difference in Difference and Repetition and The Logic of Sense. Wambacq identifies three principle “dimensions” of flesh. First, flesh is “differential”: its “unity” is to perpetually differentiate itself in creative manners that “deform” what is possible to perceive and think (p. 59). Second, flesh has an “open nature”: it is indeterminacy that allows for determinations of being but that cannot itself be determinately objectified (p. 60). Third, flesh is “constitutive” of new crystallizations that emerge at the hinge of the invisible and the visible. Wambacq discovers resonances of these dimensions of “flesh” in her account of Deleuze’s “differential ontology” (p. 65). First, what Deleuze calls “virtual being” is a vital force whose unity can be found only in its ceaseless drive to express itself in an endless play of differences, as in Deleuze’s interpretation of Nietzsche’s eternal return of the Same. Second, virtual being constantly poses itself as a question that finds answers for itself in the actual, without thereby disappearing as a problem perpetually demanding a solution. Third, the virtual is the crystallization of singular individuals that give concrete shape to a pre-individuated but not for that matter merely chaotic state, as a seed crystal introduces its nascent shape to the molecules of a substance capable of taking on any number of different shapes. What emerges from this chapter is an immanent ontology of the flesh or the virtual as an ongoing event of individuation and differentiation that makes clear powerful resonances between Merleau-Ponty and Deleuze. It also introduces what Wambacq takes to be the foremost difference between Merleau-Ponty and Deleuze: while Merleau-Ponty’s flesh is “soft,” enabling new forms to crystallize in a “non-threatening” fashion, Deleuze’s virtual threatens to “unsettle every form” (pp. 83-84).

Chapter Three, “Deleuze’s and Merleau-Ponty’s Transcendental Projects,” is the longest and most academic chapter. Deleuze puts forward two constraints for an immanent transcendental philosophy: first, the condition cannot be located outside of what it grounds, and second the condition cannot be conceived in similar terms to that which it conditions. Wambacq contrasts Deleuze’s “transcendental empiricism” with Kant’s transcendental idealism and Husserl’s transcendental phenomenology, claiming ultimately that, contrary to their intentions, the earlier philosophers do not succeed at developing philosophies of immanence that respect Deleuze’s two constraints. In some discussions that are quite illuminating for her central argument, Wambacq also traces Deleuze’s indebtedness to Leibniz’s monism and Spinoza’s theory of expression. Next, she discusses at length Merleau-Ponty’s relationship to Husserl, arguing that there are more important philosophical differences between the two than Merleau-Ponty himself is inclined to acknowledge. Merleau-Ponty tends to emphasize existentialist elements in Husserl’s thought, stressing the continuities between their two phenomenological projects vis-à-vis concepts such as the life-world, passive synthesis, operative intentionality, and the impossibility of a complete phenomenological reduction. However, Wambacq argues that there remains an idealist commitment to transcendental consciousness in Husserl and, for that matter, in Merleau-Ponty’s philosophy of the body-subject in Phenomenology of Perception, which Merleau-Ponty overcomes in his dissolving of subjectivity in his ontology of the flesh in The Visible and the Invisible.

Chapters Four, Five, and Six can all be read as relatively autonomous studies that build upon and deepen what has been established up to this point in the book, especially in its first two chapters. They also comprise some of the most concrete and enjoyable discussions of the book. In Chapter Four, “Merleau-Ponty and Deleuze, Readers of Bergson,” Wambacq engages in detail with Deleuze and Merleau-Ponty’s interpretations of Bergson’s conception of time in order to advance the thesis that we should understand the relationship between the condition and the conditioned not in terms of a mechanistic relationship of cause and effect proper to an abstract, spatialized conception of time, but rather in terms of a simultaneity or intertwinement in which the past lives on — and comes to be determined as the past that it is — in the present. From this perspective, time is not a container in which events take place, but — as with Merleau-Ponty’s “flesh” and Deleuze’s “multiplicity” — just is the production of qualitative differences. Chapter Five, “Deleuze and Merleau-Ponty, Readers of Proust,” and Chapter Six, “Cézanne in Deleuze’s and Merleau-Ponty’s Philosophy of Art,” both deal in greater detail with the conception of expression and the philosophy of immanence advanced in the first two chapters, and can be read as companions — replete with helpful examples from literature, music, and painting — to some of the concepts discussed more abstractly in the earlier foundational chapters. The discussions of Proust’s Remembrance of Time Past as it is taken up by Merleau-Ponty and Deleuze, which also link in interesting ways to the discussion of time in Chapter Four, are in my view some of the best in Wambacq’s book; the discussions of paintings by Cézanne and Bacon help especially to bring out the weight of the contrast between representational and original thought in Chapter One and provide some concrete aesthetic examples of the stylistic distinction Wambacq finds between Merleau-Ponty’s “pious” conception of flesh and Deleuze’s potentially “threatening” virtual in the conclusion to Chapter Two.

The seventh and final chapter, “Deleuze and Merleau-Ponty, Readers of Saussure,” examines the transformative relationship that each of Deleuze and Merleau-Ponty take up with regards to the movement of Structuralism in France in the 1950s and 60s, and especially to the structuralist linguistics of Saussure. In short, Wambacq offers a compelling argument that through both Merleau-Ponty and Deleuze we find a creative engagement with Saussure’s thought that is indebted to the latter’s emphasis on the diacritical or differential source of sense — the elements of linguistic expressions enjoy their identity inseparably from the manner in which they are differentiated from other signs — but that resists the latter’s stress on the arbitrariness of the signifier in the expression of the signified. The signified does not exist fully formed before and apart from the signifier, but, as in the relationship between condition and conditioned established earlier in the book, the sense of the signified is reliant on being expressed, even as it is not reducible to these (not arbitrary but nevertheless contingent) expressions. This chapter helps to establish Merleau-Ponty as a “post-structuralist” thinker while also acknowledging Deleuze’s debt to structuralist thought.

Wambacq’s book is valuable for two principle reasons. First and foremost, it advances an immanent ontology of expression that is learned, thoughtful, and illustrated through insightful observations of concrete phenomena and illuminating discussions of examples from both everyday life and works of art. Second, it enables readers to see the thought of both Merleau-Ponty and Deleuze in new lights: Merleau-Ponty’s development is traced so as to reveal a philosopher who moves beyond a philosophy of (embodied) consciousness in order to advance an immanent ontology of expression and difference more typically associated with post-structuralist thought than with the phenomenological tradition, and Deleuze is shown to us as a thinker who continues, while deepening and unsettling, a transcendental philosophy in the Kantian and phenomenological traditions. However, a word of criticism is in order — a word with which I suspect Wambacq, on her own philosophical terms, would be likely to be sensitive.

From my perspective, the best philosophical writing is always an instance of original rather than merely representational thought, in the sense described by Wambacq in Chapter One. This can include (though it certainly does not always) “secondary” literature on the work of famous philosophers, which in its best instances is hermeneutical work that is not a matter of “counting up citations,” as Merleau-Ponty writes in Phenomenology of Perception, but that “thinks according to” what the philosopher in question makes it possible to think for the first time or anew (PP lxxi, PP 184). In other words — this time from Merleau-Ponty in “The Philosopher and His Shadow” (PS), and quoted by Wambacq in Chapter Three — the most worthwhile interpretations of a major philosopher do not merely trace the empirical history of the letter of their writings, but discover the fundamental intention or spirit at the heart of these writings and work to develop the “unthought-of” elements of the philosopher’s thought (PS 160, quoted in Wambacq, p. 108). Thinking Between Deleuze and Merleau-Ponty is in its best respects an example of this kind of hermeneutical work: it does not restrict itself to the orthodox letter of Deleuze and Merleau-Ponty’s texts, but rather constitute a series of “coherent deformations” that at once conserve the spirit of the philosophers’ work and generate a creative sense of their own.

However, on this very point I think that Wambacq’s book holds itself back and even enacts a performative contradiction of the central point it establishes in its first chapter about the distinction between representational and original thought. Though it itself is a fundamentally creative work vis-à-vis its interpretation of the work of Merleau-Ponty and Deleuze, it is at times overburdened by its desire to provide “correct,” to-the-letter representations of philosophical texts of the views of a variety of philosophical thinkers, from Kant, to Husserl, to Sartre, to Saussure, to at times Merleau-Ponty and Deleuze themselves. Indeed, it even at a number of points takes Merleau-Ponty to task for his loose and “incorrect” — but in the terms of original thought arguably inspired and in a deep and creative sense true — interpretations of Husserl and Saussure, implicitly reducing the spirit of original philosophical endeavors to their letter and, perhaps, reducing generative truth to correct representation of already established or “common sense” philosophical positions. It is for this reason that despite its merits I find the third chapter, which attempts to situate Deleuze and Merleau-Ponty’s work in their larger context in the history of philosophy, the weakest of the book and indeed in some respects a detraction from its chief successes. Unlike the spirit animating the central movement of the book, what happens here — as well as at a number of other places in the book — relies for its arguments largely on second-hand “representations” of major philosophical insights, sometimes primarily engaging with secondary literature on, say, Kant and his relationship with Deleuze, rather than grappling with Kant’s sense-generating philosophical work itself in the same spirit that the book as a whole approaches the philosophical work of Merleau-Ponty and Deleuze.

With this reservation noted, I will reiterate that Wambacq’s book is a work of original philosophical research that will be a good resource for scholars of Merleau-Ponty, Deleuze, and twentieth-century Continental philosophy more broadly. At its best it both advances a powerful ontological point of view and enables us to see important new aspects of the philosophies of both Merleau-Ponty and Deleuze.


Maurice Merleau-Ponty, Phenomenology of Perception, trans. Donald A. Landes, Routledge, 2012.

Maurice Merleau-Ponty, “The Philosopher and His Shadow,” Signs, trans. Richard C. McLeary, Northwestern University Press, 1964.

Maurice Merleau-Ponty, The Visible and the Invisible, Followed By Working Notes, trans. Alphonso Lingis, Northwestern University Press, 1968.