Thinking in Literature: Joyce, Woolf, Nabokov

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Anthony Uhlmann, Thinking in Literature: Joyce, Woolf, Nabokov, Continuum, 2011, 164pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441140562.

Reviewed by Gerald Bruns, University of Notre Dame


What makes the question of "thinking in literature" arise? No doubt the traditional answer still carries weight: Plato gave the poet his once and future identity by making him (if "him" is the word) a philosophical outcast. Impersonators, image-makers, and storytellers are incompatible with a just and rational state over which the philosopher presides as "the guardian of rationality."[1] But it was as such a guardian that Aristotle reconceptualized poetry so as to find a place for it within his own teachings. The concepts of mimesis and plot show that poetry is a kind of knowledge and that it hangs together consecutively -- has, in some sense, a logic that makes it at least a subsidiary of the philosopher's corporation (Poetics, 1451-52).

One shortfall of this line of thinking is that it reduces literature to its narrative form and thus brackets much of what is original and compelling about literary modernism, principally its experiments with language (recall the way Aristotle brushes aside lexis as a thing of small importance). The French poet Stéphane Mallarmé's canonical argument is that a poem is made of words but not of any of the things we use words to produce -- concepts, propositions, narratives, expressions of feeling.[2] Imagine literature, not as a form of mediation on behalf of something outside itself, but as material artifact on the model of Flaubert's

book about nothing, a book dependent on nothing external, which would be held together by the strength of its style, just as the earth, suspended in the void, depends on nothing external for its support, a book which would have almost no subject, or at least in which the subject would be almost invisible, if such a thing is possible.[3]

Think of Joyce's Finnegans Wake, a book held together by its "once current puns, quashed quotatoes, messes of mottage," and further words to that effect.[4]

For most philosophers, however, the Aristotelian reduction to narrative is a small price to pay for literature's justification (or for philosophy's jurisdiction). Thus Alasdair MacIntyre thinks the "quest narrative" provides an image of the good life that each of us, even philosophers, can internalize.[5] Meanwhile, Martha Nussbaum defends the novel as a practice and not just an analogue of moral philosophy because it shows us how moral agents act when principles and rules no longer match the complex particulars of human situations.[6] For D. Z. Phillips, taking inspiration from Wittgenstein and Peter Winch, the novel is a form of thinking with examples rather than with concepts.[7] And for Paul Ricoeur narrative is the medium of self-knowledge and even self-formation -- a philosophical project that the modernist text (James Joyce'sUlysses, for example) subverts with its turn toward formal complexity and the materiality of écriture.[8]

Anthony Uhlmann's Thinking in Literature is squarely in this Aristotelian tradition. Uhlmann wants to redeem literary modernism by showing "how the Modernist novel might be understood as a machine for thinking, and further how it might offer a means of coming to terms with what it means to think" (p. 3). This means "getting beyond words" (p. 12) and addressing the novels of James Joyce, Virginia Woolf, and Vladimir Nabokov in terms of concepts derived from Spinoza and Leibniz -- "relation," "sensation," and "composition." Not surprisingly, Uhlmann updates these concepts with the help of Gilles Deleuze's studies of Spinoza and Leibniz, such that the concept of relation, for example, becomes useful with respect to art because it involves "a kind of linking or connection that proceeds across gaps, urging flashes of insight to emerge, to speak from ourselves to the mute tableau, as a lightening flash leaps from the sky to the ground, or a signal across a synapse" (p. 12). So a Cubist collage or one of Samuel Beckett's later fictions is not simply an aleatoric assembly of random particles but an example of the disjunctive logic (parataxis) of literary modernism.[9] Here, for example, is a passage from Beckett's "Worstward Ho":

First one. First try fail better one. Something there badly not wrong. No that as it is it is not bad. The no face bad. The no hands bad. The no -- . Enough. A pox on bad. Mere bad way for worse. Pending worse still. First worse. Mere worse. Pending worse still. Add a -- . Add? Never. Bow it down. Be it bowed down. Deep down. Head in hat gone. More back gone. Greatcoat cut off higher. Nothing from pelvis down. Nothing but bowed back. Topless baseless hindtrunk. Dim black. On unseen knees. In the dim void. Better worse so. Pending worse still.[10]

Moreover, the modernist work does not simply mirror reality; it constructs a possible world, one perhaps incongruous with things as they are but one which can have "real effects" upon the way we can inhabit or even alter the world as we find it (p. 27). Thinking in literature, Uhlmann writes,

involves the creation of complicated worlds; worlds that provoke us to an interpretation [which] we are asked to bring . . . into relation with our own world view; to use it in order to produce effects within our own lives; that is, to translate the complicated worlds of others from the possible worlds of fiction into what Leibniz calls our own 'clear zone': the place in which we are able to understand, or apprehend a sense of the unity that underlies the multiple (p. 31).

As in Paul Ricoeur's hermeneutics, understanding a text means appropriating a possible world projected in front of the text, not grasping a reality or intention that lies behind it.[11] Map Beckett's metaphysics onto one's own and see who laughs last.

At the same time, the modernist work thinks in sensations rather than by means of concepts. Here Uhlmann, perhaps as a way of splitting the difference between Aristotle and modernism, refers us to Deleuze and Guattari's What is Philosophy? with its conception of art as the composition of disparate materials into a self-standing unity of sensations, percepts and affects:

We paint, sculpt, compose, and write with sensations. As percepts, sensations are not perceptions referring to an object (reference); if they resemble something it is with a resemblance produced by their own methods; and the smile on the canvas is made solely with colors, lines, shadow, and light. If resemblance haunts the work of art, it is because sensation refers only to its material: it is the percept or affect of the material itself, the smile of oil, the gesture of fired clay, the thrust of metal, the crouch of Romanesque stone, and the ascent of Gothic stone. The material is so varied in each case (canvas support, paint-brush or equivalent agent, color in the tube) that it is difficult to say where in fact the material ends and sensation begins; preparation of the canvas, the track of the brush's hair, and many other things besides are obviously part of the sensation.[12]

So the work is a material construction rather than a medium of expression: "The work of art is a being of sensation and nothing else: it exists in itself" (What is Philosophy?, p. 164). Its intelligibility is compositional rather than referential; it is a formal unity -- words on a page that, like Beckett's "Worstward Ho," mirrors a distinctive idiom more than a passing show. This autotelic arrangement is what splitting the difference between Aristotle and modernism comes down to. At least, in contrast to Adorno's aesthetics, some version of the classical ideal of unity is allowed to stand.[13]

Uhlmann's critical task is to bring these concepts of relation, sensation, and composition down to earth by showing their application to Joyce's Ulysses, Woolf's Waves andTo the Lighthouse, and Nabokov's early novel, Despair. On this score most readers of these novelists will find themselves on familiar ground. Thus Joyce's Ulysses is a monumental work of literary naturalism -- a montage of persons, places, and things passing the day and a good bit of the night in Dublin on June 14, 1904 -- but its details fold into one another to form an intricate network of allusions and correspondences. Uhlmann emphasizes the complexity of relations within and among the novel's characters, whose watchwords are metempsychosis and parallax: each character is a singularity who nevertheless incarnates multiple identities in a steady state of alteration as contexts accumulate and viewpoints change. "I am another now, and yet the same," says Stephen Dedalus.[14] It all depends on who happens to be regarding him at any moment, whether he himself, another character, or the reader armed with Joyce's Homeric schema.

Uhlmann locates Virginia Woolf in the artworld of Cézanne (as seen through the eyes of the Bloomsbury art critic, Roger Fry), where sensation is not an empirical concept but something like a riveting perceptual experience that one preserves and embellishes by means of composition, whether on the canvas or the page.

The moment of being Woolf describes is a moment of pure and intense sensation. It is intense because it involves the folding within of pure potential. All life, or at least a clue to its meaning, is condensed into a moment, is held within that moment. In writing one seeks to recapture such a moment or to approximate the intense sensations it produces by other means. Such a moment, however, because it is folded in, might in turn be unfolded, teased out, either in interpretation, or in the stories which surround that moment, leading up to and away from it (p. 113).

Indeed, Deleuze's fold is one of the regulating ideas of Thinking in Literature[15]―although oddly Uhlmann seems to skirt its relevance to Nabokov's Despair, which is adoppelgänger novel that folds the history of the genre into its own details of character and event. Hermann, the narrator, tells the story of his "work of art," namely a "perfect crime" in which he fashions a double of himself out of a vagrant named Felix, whom he then kills in order to collect the insurance upon his own fabricated "death." There are folds within folds within the novel, the whole of which is further folded into the foreground of Nabokov's language, which is made of puns, anagrams, and other forms of modernist wordplay. Despair (which Nabokov originally composed in his native Russian) is, among other things, a parody of Dostoevsky's Crime and Punishment, whose hero is here identified as Rascalnikov.

Naturally the question remains: what is it that we call thinking, whether in philosophy or literature? On this subject Uhlmann seems to me a formalist whose interests are finally in how things are made rather than in what they mean. In this respect, of course, he remains a modernist in the constructivist tradition that extends from Flaubert and Mallarmé through the Russian Futurists, much of modern European and North American poetry -- and, among other forms and movements, the Ouvroir de littérature potentielle, or Oulipo, a group of conceptual writers that includes the French novelist Georges Perec, who once composed a three-hundred page novel without using the letter "e."[16] Indeed, the question of thinking in literature ought properly to be pursued through a study of Conceptual Art, where the understanding of an artwork, even a piece of art trouvé like one of Marcel Duchamp's Readymades, means understanding the thinking that made it happen. In a celebrated essay, "Art after Philosophy" (1969), Joseph Kosuth explains:

Works of art are analytic propositions. That is, if viewed within their context -- as art -- they provide no information whatsoever about any matter of fact. A work of art is a tautology in that it is a presentation of the artist's intention, that is, he is saying that a particular work of art is art, which means, is a definition of art.[17]

A final question worth posing is what happens when composition and thinking undergo a technological transformation? At work now are writers of experimental fiction like Steve Tomasula who have crossed over into the world of digital construction in which the work is made of words and images whose forms and relations change as the reader moves through the three-dimensional space in which they are suspended.[18] Digital poetics is engaged in the production of what Deleuze and Guattari would call "multiplicities" pursuing nomadic "lines of flight."[19] To be sure, against the anarchy of "open" or "chance" forms of composition, digital philosophy "insists that 'things just don't happen.'"[20] To which a conceptual artist like Sol Lewitt would reply: Of course not. "The idea [is] the machine that makes the art," Lewitt writes. "The idea itself, even if not made visual [or verbal], is as much a work of art as any finished product." One of Lewitt's monochrome paintings, or Duchamp's urinal, "is made to engage the mind of the viewer rather than his eye or emotions."[21]

Certainly for most philosophers the poet will always be "a light and winged thing, and holy, and never able to compose until he has become inspired and is beside himself, and reason is no longer in him" (Ion, 534b). Still, it is a fact that the history of poetics is a history of writings about poetry, not by philosophers or literary critics, but by poets -- Horace, Dante, Pope, Wordsworth, Mallarmé, Paul Celan: poets possessed, not by muses, but by concepts of their own invention. In which case thinking would not be something that literature contains or performs; it would be the literary thing itself.

[1] On the figure of the philosopher as "the guardian of rationality," see Jürgen Habermas, "Philosophy as Stand-in and Interpreter," Moral Consciousness and Communicative Action, trans. Christian Lenhardt and Shierry Weber Nicholsen (Cambridge: MIT Press, 1990), pp. 1-20.

[2] See "Crisis in Verse," Mallarmé: Selected Prose Poems, Essays, & Letters, trans. Bradford Cook (Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1956), esp. p. 40: "If the poem is to be pure, the poet's voice must be stilled and the initiative taken by the words themselves, which will be set in motion as they meet unequally in collision."

[3] Letter to Louise Colet, 16 January 1852. Selected Letters of Gustave Flaubert, trans. Francis Steegmuller (New York: Farrar, Straus, & Cudahy, 1953), pp. 127-28.

[4] (New York: The Viking Press, 1939), p. 186.

[5] After Virtue: A Study in Moral Theory (Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 1981).

[6] Love's Knowledge: Essays on Philosophy and Literature (New York: Oxford University Press, 1990).

[7] Through a Darkening Glass: Philosophy, Literature, and Cultural Change (Notre Dame, IN: University of Notre Dame Press, 1982).

[8] Time and Narrative. 3 vols. (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1984).

[9] See Jean-François Lyotard, The Differend (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1988), pp. 65-66.

[10] Samuel Beckett, "Worstward Ho," Nohow On (Paris: Calder Publications, 1992), p. 111.

[11] Hermeneutics and the Human Sciences: Essays on Language, Action, and Interpretation, ed. John B. Thompson (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1981), pp. 93-94.

[12] Trans. Hugh Tomlinson and Graham Burchell (New York: Columbia University Press, 1994), p. 166.

[13] "Dissonance," Adorno writes, "is the truth about harmony. . . . Art, whatever its material, has always desired dissonance." Aesthetic Theory, trans. Robert Hullot-Kantor (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1997), p. 110. On Adorno's critique of classical aesthetics, see pp. 160-63.

[14] Ulysses (New York: Vintage Books, 1961), p. 11.

[15] The Fold: Leibniz and the Baroque, trans. Tom Conley (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1993).

[16] See Oulipo: A Primer of Potential Literature, ed. Warren F. Motte, Jr. (Normal, IL: Dalkey Archive Press, 1998); and Perec, La Disparation (Paris: Gallimard, 1969).

[17] Conceptual Art: A Critical Anthology, ed. Alexander Alberro and Blake Stimson (Cambridge: MIT Press, 1999), p. 165.

[18] See, for example, Toc, a work of "hybrid" (visual and acoustic, as well as verbal) fiction by Steve Tomasula, Stephen Farrell, and Christian Jara, available on DVD from the University of Alabama Press (Tuscaloosa, 2009).

[19] A Thousand Plateaus: Capitalism and Schizophrenia, trans. Brian Massumi (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1987), esp. pp. 482-88. See Media Poetry: An Anthology, ed. Eduardo Kac (Chicago: Intellect Books, 2007)

[20] Edward Friedkin, "Introduction to Digital Philosophy," International Journal of Theoretical Physics, 41, no. 2 (February 2003), 200.

[21] "Paragraphs on Conceptual Art" (1967), Conceptual Art: A Critical Anthology, pp. 13-15.