Thinking like a Mall: Environmental Philosophy after the End of Nature

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Steven Vogel, Thinking like a Mall: Environmental Philosophy after the End of Nature, MIT Press, 2015, 283pp., $29.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262029100.

Reviewed by Gary Varner, Texas A&M University


The title of this book is a riff on Aldo Leopold's famous "Thinking Like a Mountain" vignette,1 and the subtitle points to Bill McKibben's 1989 book announcing The End of Nature. Steven Vogel's purpose is to describe an appropriate project for environmental philosophers on the assumption that nothing on Earth remains untouched by human practices. His answer is that we should never have thought of "nature" as what is unaffected by human practices because both the built and "natural" environments have been shaped by human practices for as long as there have been human beings. Once we realize how and why that was so, he argues, we can see that our practices should have been the focus of environmental philosophy all along: we need to take responsibility for the fact that our practices are inherently collective and they shape both the built and "natural" environments, and we must work to end our "alienation" from both environments by developing a "discursive democracy" that meaningfully involves us all in choosing what environments (both built and "natural") to live in.

In the opening chapter, "Against Nature," Vogel emphasizes how many environmental philosophers and activists have placed a premium on "natural environments" and on "following nature," where "nature" is conceived as what is unaffected by humans. McKibben claims that human influence on the biosphere is now so pervasive that "nature" in this sense has ended: "We have deprived nature of its independence, and that is fatal to its meaning. Nature's independence is its meaning; without it there is nothing but us."2 So in this first sense, it's too late for environmentalists to save nature. Vogel points out that in another familiar sense, "nature" refers to everything that happens in accordance with the laws of nature (in contrast to the "supernatural"), but in that sense, of course, nothing that humans could do would be unnatural. Vogel spends several pages considering other sense of what is "natural," according to which "it is living things that are natural, plus the habitats or biosphere within which they live" (p. 16), and argues that none of them results in an empirical description of humans as distinct from nature in the way environmentalists want. He concludes that environmentalists' conception of nature is best understood as a metaphysical claim and "functions less as an account of what nature is than as an account of what human beings are -- creatures who transcend nature, and transcend it because of their minds" (p. 21). This is, ironically, "an essentially Cartesian anthropocentrism that fits uncomfortably with the other theoretical commitments most environmental philosophers typically defend" (p. 26).

Vogel concludes the first chapter by calling for "an environmental philosophy of the 'postnatural' world," one that "eschew[s]" the concept of "nature" (p. 26). That such an environmental philosophy is necessary, he says, is clear from the fact that "the problems of pollution and toxic waste and water shortages and global warming and resource depletion that we face today are all problems that arise here, in the human, 'non-natural' world" (p. 30), and (as he says later in the book) without appealing to "nature" as a standard, we can still ask meaningful questions about policies affecting the "natural" world. The task for the remainder of the book, then, is to show how "without appeal to nature, a normative standard can still be found that can help answer those questions" (p. 30).

In chapter two, "The Social Construction of Nature," Vogel distinguishes two forms of social constructionism. In the first, "traditional" form, social constructionism "unmasks something whose existence has been claimed to be an obvious and eternal fact of the world and reveals instead the social processes through which that thing has come into being" (p. 38). Since this "seems to require assuming the existence of something that is not so constructed, not produced by people, without a historical origin" (p. 39), however, "we need to give up the [traditional] notion of social construction just as much as we need to give up the notion of nature" (pp. 39-40). What Vogel later refers to as "postnatural social constructionism" would instead "emphasize . . . that the environment we encounter and live within is always already a built environment" (p. 58). Vogel means this to apply quite literally and all the way back to prehistoric times, as he illustrates with the following example. A house is an obvious example of a built environment. It is made of lumber, which comes from trees that seem to grow on their own, but today's trees are the result of human forestry practices. Those practices were initially applied to ancestral forests, "But now we are back at the problem of wilderness, thinking about old-growth forests and what the impact on them was of Native American logging and burning and other practices" (p. 60). Vogel concludes that we should "admit that the matter on which our practices work is always itself in part a product of other, previous practices, and so is itself just as much an element of the built environment we inhabit" (pp. 61-62).

In this context, the third chapter, "Alienation, Nature, and the Environment," explains how we can be "alienated" in the same way from both the "natural" and the "built" environment. For Marx, we are alienated from the world of "produced objects . . . when we are unable to see it as something we have produced, and when it accordingly begins to appear as an alien power over and against us" (p. 72). The solution is "a system of conscious and democratically controlled social planning and production" that allows humans to "reassert their power over that which had come to seem alien and independent of them" (pp. 78-79). Analogously, Vogel argues, alienation from our environment -- meaning both "nature" and the one we've more directly and literally "produced" -- would consist in lacking connection to "the (socially) built character of the world we actually inhabit" (p. 79). So environmentalists' tendency to identify "the environment" with a "nature" that is "separate from the human . . . is itself a symptom of alienation" (p. 89).

The next two chapters emphasize that seeing our environment as "built" by our collective practices does not mean seeing it as under our complete control. In chapter four, "The Nature of Artifacts," Vogel emphasizes that "To construct an artifact is always to put processes into motion whose workings we do not fully understand and whose consequences we do not fully foresee" (p. 112). For instance, in producing a loaf of bread, one relies on "complex biochemical processes taking place within millions of yeast cells, processes one cannot hope to fully understand or predict" (p. 113). Noting that humans can also "intend for unintended processes to be allowed to operate" (p. 106), Vogel suggests that restoring ecosystems be understood as aiming to let processes that are not completely understood come to dominate a landscape with the result resembling an earlier time (p. 106), so that "the wildness that we're after is there all the time, throughout the restoration process; it's not something that comes in at the end, not something that we produce, but rather something that we use" (p. 111). He also emphasizes that practicing restoration ecology helps instill the virtue of humility (pp. 119-121).

Chapter five, "Thinking like a Mall," begins with a sort of case study in humility by describing the "life" of the Center City Mall in Columbus, Ohio. When it opened in 1989, it was an "upscale" development intended to revitalize a downtown in decline, but unforeseen economic forces put it into decline itself and only twenty years later it was demolished. Like Leopold's mountain, Vogel argues, the mall illustrates how extremely complex "the environment" is, and how widespread and sometimes unforeseeable are the effects of local changes. Vogel also uses the mall as an occasion for reflection on similarities between complex artifacts and biological organisms. He sees similarities that biocentric individualists like Paul Taylor, Kenneth Goodpaster, and Robin Attfield typically deny: its unpredictable behavior exhibits "a kind of independence from human beings" (p. 146), and like an organism (or Leopold's mountain) it can be understood as having a teleological character, with an associated good or purpose of its own (pp. 137-158).

In the penultimate chapter, "The Silence of Nature," Vogel says that two characteristics that "seem to be unique to humans" are language use and "the realm of the political." The two are related because "[the] sociality and [the] normativity" of the social practices through which we participate in the construction of our environment "are typically mediated through language" (p. 170). There is a lengthy discussion of related work by Jane Bennett and Bruno Latour, but the take away point is that, "As we humans speak with each other, the moral relationship that arises between us is different from any that may arise between us and the nonspeaking entities we encounter," and

we humans have no choice but to raise and discuss claims about them ourselves, not because we prefer ourselves or think we're at the center of the moral world but because we seem to be the only ones talking here and we don't know how to figure out what's true without talking (p. 195).

The final chapter, "Democracy and the Commons," describes how our alienation from "the environment" that was described in chapter three can be overcome in a "discursive democracy" (p. 226) that meaningfully involves us all in choosing what environment we live in. Here Vogel ties our alienation from the environment into the familiar "tragedy of the commons": when individuals make "private" decisions, they can collectively "choose" outcomes that none of them desires, and this is "exactly the structure that Marx described under the name of alienation" (p. 202). Vogel thinks that our environmental problems, from urban sprawl to global warming, stem from the fact that a market system drives us to make decisions that are individually rational but collectively undesirable. He emphasizes that the problem isn't fairly characterized as arising from selfishness or egoism because an individual's decision to do what would be best if everyone did it really makes the community worse off if isolated individuals do it (pp. 204-206). Vogel acknowledges that laws and economic incentives can go some way toward solving problems like pollution by internalizing externalities (p. 227), but such carrots and sticks alone will never overcome what he characterizes as our "tragic" alienation from the environments that we have collectively created. The real solution, according to Vogel, would be "to become a self-consciously organized collective" (p. 220) that can reasonably be held accountable for the large-scale impacts that it is unreasonable to hold private individuals accountable for -- a democracy in which individuals reason together about "what the most important values are" with the goal of "a consensus on the practices they wish to engage in and the goals they wish to achieve" (p. 226). Here is where Vogel sees the "normative standard" for an environmentalist agenda coming from after the end of nature: the best environment-building practices will be those that emerge from such a discursive process (p. 233), and Vogel is confident that the resulting environments -- both urban and "natural" -- would be very different from, and preferable to, what we are now creating.

This is a wide-ranging book, as my synopsis of its seven chapters illustrates (and I've left out a lot!). I think, however, that it is longer than it need have been. Some of the digressions on other authors' work could have been left out, and there is more repetition than is necessary: there are a lot of reminders about what has been argued and where Vogel is going next, but also Vogel often makes the same point several different ways. So I think that a somewhat shorter version could have made an equally or more effective book. On the other hand, the book draws on material from eight previously published essays listed in the Preface, so instructors wanting to include Vogel in their courses can get to most of the main themes using those essays.

An obvious objection to how Vogel motivates his project in chapter one would be that by no means all environmentalists, or environmental philosophers, take nature unaffected by human intention to be an ideal or the main focus of environmentalism, which Vogel sometimes characterizes as a "fetish" (e.g., pp. 110, 111, and 117). Obviously this is true of Green parties, the environmental justice movement, and ecofeminism. But Vogel is careful, at various points, to characterize his target as (e.g.) "much of contemporary environmentalism" (p. 89 -- italics added), and while one could quibble over the extent of that "much," the ideal of "pristine nature" is certainly a familiar concept in various strains of environmentalism, both popular and philosophical, and deserves the critical scrutiny he gives it.

I confess that I read Vogel's book sitting in the shade of a piñon pine in a remote area of Grand Canyon National Park, where the only obvious sign of humanity (apart from airliners overhead) was the "jeep trail" that I had driven in on. It's the kind of setting I seek out on vacations, fancying that I get a "spiritual recharge" from being in such places, and in that respect I am myself guilty of the nature "fetish" that Vogel seeks to replace with discursive democracy. Still, I felt inspired by Vogel's project. It is a clearly-written and eloquent plea for environmentalists to become engaged citizens concerned with both wild places and the urban environments that are -- for better or worse -- our natural habitat. So sitting under that piñon pine, I found myself wondering how I should become more engaged in the governance of my city, state, and nation when I got home. In Vogel's concluding chapter, however, there are no examples of discursive democracy in practice, nor even general suggestions for moving current political practices in that direction. He does admit that he is describing an "ideal type," or a "regulative ideal that should underlie the really existing politics in which we engage as actual citizens, despite our knowledge that such an ideal will never fully be achieved" (pp. 226, 227). Nevertheless, readers could at least have been referred to some works on developing a discursive democracy not driven by special interests, things like Bryan Norton's book on adaptive ecosystem management.3

Finally (and not very importantly), a pet peeve of mine is the use of endnotes in contemporary book production. I understand publishing houses' urge to avoid "cluttering" pages with footnotes, but that can be addressed using a combination of in-line citations and a minimal number of discursive footnotes. With computerized page layouts, the traditional reason for avoiding footnotes is muted, and in my judgment, the advantage of being able to quickly glance at a discursive note outweighs the aesthetic concern about the remaining "clutter."

1 Aldo Leopold, “Thinking Like a Mountain,” in A Sand County Almanac (Oxford University Press, 1949), pp. 129-133.

2 Bill McKibben, The End of Nature (Anchor Books, 1989), p. 58; quoted in Vogel, p. 3.

3 Bryan Norton, Sustainability: A Philosophy of Adaptive Ecosystem Management (University of Chicago Press, 2005).