Thinking of Others: On the Talent for Metaphor

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Ted Cohen, Thinking of Others: On the Talent for Metaphor, Princeton University Press, 2008, 89pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691137469.

Reviewed by Mark Johnson, University of Oregon


To appreciate Ted Cohen's virtues as a thinker and writer, it helps to remember that he studied under Stanley Cavell at Harvard, who was himself a student of J.L. Austin. Cohen shares Austin's great gift for nuanced observations of the conditions for, and implications of, various human practices, especially those manifested in what we say and how we communicate with others. Cohen shares Cavell's celebratory appreciation of the philosophical and moral significance of the ordinary in human life. He discerns significance in aspects of everyday life -- such as being a sports fan, being moved by a novel, or being offended by one's critics -- that are lost on most people. Like Wittgenstein, he assembles reminders of deep dimensions of mundane human practices, for which he offers no overarching explanation, but which we cannot ignore, once he has pointed these dimensions out to us.

The practices being described in this book are acts of what Cohen calls "metaphorical personal understanding" (82), by which he means, roughly, our capacity for imagining ourselves as another. The reader will not find in this little book any theory of anything. There is no theory of how metaphor works, no theory of how we can come to inhabit some character in a fiction, no theory of moral imagination. There are simply reminders of what we think and feel and imagine as we engage certain types of metaphor, certain types of fictions, and certain day-to-day experiences. Beyond these reminders, there are invitations to dwell in the experiences so described and to reflect on their meaning for your life.

The "talent for metaphor" around which Cohen's explorations center is our capacity to think of one thing, A (in the metaphor "A is B"), as another thing, B. He observes that good metaphors are seldom merely acts of intellectual or conceptual connection. Instead, "a leading aim of many metaphor-makers is the communication of some feelings they have about the subjects of their metaphors, and the hoped-for inducement of similar feelings in those who grasp their metaphors" (6). The point of Churchill's description of Mussolini as a "utensil of his master's will", or the characterization of former president George W. Bush as a "cowboy", is to engender within a specific community a strong negative reaction to certain aspects of the person's character so described.

Cohen is interested in one specific type of metaphor -- that in which the hearer is invited to imagine herself as some other particular individual, type of individual, or as herself at some future time. For example, questions such as "What if you were Jane Fonda, how would you have felt?" or "What if you were a Muslim in the midst of Serbs?" require us to imagine ourselves as what we are not, but what we might be in other circumstances. Cohen asks us to consider how we perform such imaginative feats and how that can affect our lives. His general thesis is that, "understanding one another involves thinking of oneself as another, and thus the talent for doing this must be related to the talent for thinking of one thing as another" (9), which is the talent for metaphor.

Much of Cohen's book is devoted to showing that our ability to enact a metaphorical personal understanding is not merely a feat of conceptual identification, but rather a potentially transformative personal act capable of re-figuring our sense of self, of who we are and how we should live. Perhaps Cohen's most compelling illustration of this type of experience is his recounting of the biblical story of Nathan and David. Recall that, while Uriah is away fighting the Ammonites, King David impregnates Uriah's wife, Bathsheba. David recalls Uriah from battle, hoping that he will sleep with his wife, so that it will appear to everyone that the baby is Uriah's. However, when this ploy fails, David plots to send Uriah back into battle, arranging for supporting soldiers to be withdrawn in the heat of the battle, leading to Uriah's death. David then calls the widowed, pregnant Bathsheba to live with him in the palace. But the Lord God sends Nathan to relate to King David the story of a rich man who had many herds of sheep and a poor man who had but one small lamb, which he held dear and treated virtually as a member of his own family. However, when a traveler comes to the city, the rich man kills the poor man's one lamb and serves it to his guest. Upon hearing of this deed,

David's anger was greatly kindled against the man; and he said to Nathan, As the Lord liveth, the man that hath done this thing shall surely die: And he shall restore the lamb fourfold, because he did this thing, and because he had no pity. And Nathan said to David, Thou art the man.

The shock of "Thou art the man" is the shock of personal metaphorical identification, in which seeing oneself as another can be the basis for a re-configuration of one's self.

Cohen sees in Arnold Isenberg's description of the nature and function of art criticism this same process of projective imagination. Isenberg argued that the critic points to various elements and relations in an artwork with the goal of inducing "sameness of vision" and thus a shared community of feeling. Just as with the making and understanding of good metaphors, there are no rules or standard methods for helping the audience see or hear or feel what the critic sees or hears or feels.

This ability to enter imaginatively into a story and to project oneself into a character is not an exclusively literary act. In a succession of short chapters, Cohen shows that something akin to this capacity is necessary for a number of basic life activities, such as: being a true fan, imagining yourself as another, imagining how others see you, understanding how a reviewer views your work, and imagining yourself at some future time. Space does not permit a discussion of each of these important phenomena, but I will briefly mention one of them -- the experience of the sports fan -- as quintessential Cohen in its ability to find deep significance in what might seem to be trivial affairs. Drawing on a quotation from Julius (Dr. J) Irving about excellence in sports, Cohen describes virtuosity as "the exhibition of something difficult done without apparent effort," as in Dr. J's justly famous reverse lay-ups initiated from distances that to most of us seem impossible to traverse in one bodily motion, or Michael Jordan's unbelievable mid-air adjustment of his right-handed lay-up to a left-handed semi-reverse lay-up in split-second response to the defender's hand. To love the game, as all true fans do, requires being able to appreciate the beauty and virtuosity of such performances, and this seems somehow to require at least a partial ability to imagine yourself trying to carry off such feats. In this delightful chapter, Cohen moves, almost by sleight of hand, from his appreciation of virtuosity to his closing meditation on how much imaginative projection is required to empathize with a fan of a losing team that you, being an ardent fan of your own team, happen to despise, or at least hope will lose.

By my lights, the crowning glory of the book is the chapter on how we experience genuine emotions in our encounter with what we know, quite consciously, to be fictional narrative. This is Cohen at his best, providing what might be thought of as existence proofs of the type of imaginative phenomenon that is the subject of the book. In other words, he seeks either to remind you, if you already knew it, or to convince you, if you did not, that when we imaginatively enter into the unfolding plot, with its development of characters and a testing out of them in various concrete situations, we become emotionally involved in their lives. We feel Sophie's anguish in William Styron's Sophie's Choice, when she is forced to pick which of her two children will live and which will die. We feel Jake Gittes' horror when he finally grasps the enormity of Noah Cross's evil. We ache when Juliet drinks the poison, even as Romeo is about to enter the tomb. In a series of probing reflections that move from bull-fighting to baseball to novels to poetry, Cohen attempts to nudge us toward the realization that, "whether or not fictional stories take us into some other 'world,' a fictional world, they can teach us about our world, the real world, and they also can inspire real-world feelings" (51). It is precisely this sentiment that has led generations of philosophers and literary theorists, from Aristotle to Leo Tolstoy to John Gardner to Martha Nussbaum to Richard Eldridge, to see literary narratives as occasions for moral, spiritual, and social exploration and self-cultivation.

Although he does not dwell on this point at great length, I believe that the deepest significance of metaphorical personal understanding rests in its lying at the heart of our ability to make sensitive, intelligent moral judgments. This theme emerges in the penultimate chapter "Lessons from Art", where Cohen says,

I think our ability to tell stories that promise to secure human understanding is nothing more or less than one of the powers of art. And I think our ability to be reached by this power is itself nothing more or less than what we could call our moral imagination, and that, I think, is deployed in our comprehension of what I am calling metaphors of personal identification. (72)

This capacity for imaginative identification is an art that cannot be taught by rules. It has to be nurtured by doing -- by enacting it -- just as Aristotle saw. Cohen points out that the connection between "the ability to fully appreciate narrative fiction and the ability to participate in the morality of life" (73) is not a relation of identity. The phenomenon of educated, sophisticated Nazis is proof of that. Rather, both of these abilities are instances of our general capacity to imagine one's self as another. People who go to literature, not just for entertainment, but because literary fictions show them ways of inhabiting their world, show them who they are and what they might be like if they could imagine themselves otherwise, will resonate with Cohen's observations.

It seems appropriate to close with Cohen's intriguing thoughts on the experience of having one's own work reviewed by another. When, as is so often the case, we find our reviewer taking issue with our claims, or finding fault in our evidence, methods, or arguments, we are challenged to ask, "How could he see me like that?" Cohen explains:

I have written something very deep; he finds it trite. I have said all that can be said; he finds my writing incomplete and unfinished. When I read these responses I say of the reviewer, he is a poor reader -- careless and too quick -- or he is biased, or he is stupid. But when I have calmed, I might ask how is it that my writing can have struck him this way? (66-67)

As reviewers, we hope that the author on whom we have lavished our attention can, indeed, imagine how we could have seen him or her as we have. We like to imagine ourselves as neither poor readers, careless, over hasty, biased or just plain stupid.