Thinking through Breast Cancer: A Philosophical Exploration of Diagnosis, Treatment, and Survival

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Mary Ann G. Cutter, Thinking through Breast Cancer: A Philosophical Exploration of Diagnosis, Treatment, and Survival, Oxford University Press, 2018, 256pp., $34.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780190637033.

Reviewed by Marta Bertolaso, University Campus Bio-Medico, Rome


This accessible monograph is an interesting attempt to demonstrate the importance and usefulness of philosophy for generating critical thinking, multiple questions and points of view. Its focus is breast cancer, a complex phenomenon that sooner or later could become a part of anyone's life. Mary Ann G. Cutter is a philosopher of medicine and a breast cancer patient herself. For many scientific, epidemiological and socio-economic reasons (also spelled out in the Introduction) the topic will likely attract many readers. The book is written in plain language, and the autobiographical style of several passages (including the regular "Personal musings" section in each chapter) no doubt cooperates to the effectiveness of the message. When needed, Cutter explains the etymology of technical terms and the background of different views. The structure is easy to follow, logical and clear, and the symmetrical structuring, although sometimes a bit rigid and constraining, provides a good feeling of orderliness. Personal musings at the beginning of the chapters are interesting, useful and engaging: they help the reader remind the reasons why the author decided to write the book in the first place, how much involved she is in what she is describing, and the importance of the topic for individual personal life stories (we can say that Cutter's life is used as a case study). The closing medical glossary and philosophical glossary are well crafted and useful.

I will briefly review the book's contents, then focus on some epistemological proposals in Chapters 6 and 7. After a couple of critical remarks, I will go back to an overview of the other Chapters, ending with a final evaluation of the volume.

After an introduction about the importance of talking about breast cancer, Cutter (Chapters 2-5) leads the reader to reflect through breast cancer (hence, I guess, the book's title) on the main topics of epistemology: realism vs. instrumentalism, physicalism, reductionism vs. holism, empiricism and rationalism, skepticism, explanation, causality, determinism and uncertainty, and value-ladenness. She then analyzes breast cancer through the lens of some themes of social philosophy, such as commodification or medicalization. In this way, academic philosophy is somehow "brought down to the ground" into problems that can be faced by the readers and their loved ones: what's the evidence for someone having breast cancer? And what is breast cancer supposed to be? What should a scientific explanation of breast cancer look like? To what extent can medical doctors be certain of a diagnosis or a treatment, and in which sense? How do values and ethics influence the diagnosis, communication and treatment? And should they? And what are the social dynamics that co-emerge with the (already social) phenomenon of breast cancer?

Chapter 6 develops a positive philosophical proposal: for Cutter, breast cancer can be seen as an "integrative medical phenomenon", an "intersectional and contextual phenomenon", and a "personalized medical phenomenon". Chapter 7 is a synthetic essay on moral principles, protection practices and policies that surround breast cancer patients.

Chapter 8 contains final messages in the form of "what have I learned" from considering breast cancer under the respective dimensions presented in the Chapters. It concludes by saying that while philosophy has a lot to teach regarding how we understand and treat breast cancer and how to navigate uncertainty, breast cancer and medicine reveal our understanding of nature, knowledge and what we know and value.

As I mentioned above, Cutter has some positive proposals to advance in Chapters 6 and 7. Chapter 6 promotes an "integrative view of breast cancer", which "comes about when the dimensions of description, explanation, evaluation, and socialization . . . define and situate each other" (p. 138). It is not always clear whether Cutter is offering an integrative description of breast cancer (i.e., how we should look at it) or asserting that breast cancer has an integrative nature. Yes, we may say that the two are tightly related, but I would say they do not fully coincide. More precisely, since these dimensions do always relate to each other that way,[1] perhaps it is a matter of acknowledging that. This implies a more fluid and contextual view of diagnosis and treatment: by means of some hypothetical clinical examples, Cutter suggests that reductionist, objectivist, deterministic and positivistic assumptions could result in a rigid veneration of any diagnosis, and influence clinical choices both by the patient and by the physicians. An integrative view, instead, assumes that any knowledge (diagnosis included) results from a provisional equilibrium in the "interplay" or "intersection" between different dimensions. Overall, her proposal seems to be an advice for anyone involved to adopt critical thinking. Take for example the significant and predictable differences in the outcome of breast cancer according to social, cultural and economic conditions of the patient and of the context, due not only to wealth, but also to how all the actors in the process interpret situations, clues, their own identities, and how they choose. On the one hand, situations like this call for an explanation by an integrative view, and, on the other hand, reveal deficient care processes that could be fought by a wider adoption of an integrative view. That is why an integrative view is, for Cutter, more respectful of the patient and allows for more informed choices. Chapter 6 closes with an attempt to relate her discourse to "personalized medicine", an attempt I will comment upon below.

Chapter 7 deals with ethical aspects of breast cancer. The involved notions are complex and have a complex history: the principles of 'autonomy' and 'informed consent' are philosophically and practically challenging, leading some authors to coin the critical expression 'uninfomed consent' (Gerd Gigerenzer). The view of an autonomous agent in medicine is misleading, a situation that no guidelines could ever sufficiently resolve. Risk assessment and risk aversion are determinant factors in the patient's choices. Breast cancer specialists, on their part, have a hard time with medicine's fundamental principle of 'nonmaleficence', since many of their clinical interventions do have harmful effects. The principle of 'beneficence' is no more straightforward to apply due, in particular, to the complexity of the 'spectrum of benefit' (ranging from protection to prevention, removal, help and rescue), as well as the presence of competing goods, subjective thresholds and personal desires. As in Chapter 6, Cutter reproduces her plea for an integrative view. Biomedical ethical principles are interconnected, and the possibility of stepping back and seeing their interplay should, in Cutter's opinion, allow in the micro-context of the clinic (rather than in the macro-scale of the norms) a more just care of the patient. A key improvement in the ethics of breast cancer care -- notwithstanding the advanced status of current laws and guidelines in the U.S. -- would be, for Cutter, a more explicit discussion of uncertainty and of the ways patients make their choices.

From my point of view, Cutter's attempt to parallel her 'integrative view' and personalized medicine is pretty stretched, glossing the epistemological and economic hurdles of personalized medicine just to claim that personalized medicine, in its own way, emphasizes the same interplays and interconnections as those shown by Cutter. While it seems true that both discourses contradict the logic of "performing the same operation on all women with the disease", the commonalities tend to end here, as personalized (or precision) medicine is normally interpreted as statistic clustering of patients on the basis of their (mainly genetic, physiological, historical, lifestyle) characteristics. Not exactly like sitting down with the patient for a critical thinking session, indeed. Cutter herself describes in Chapter 5 the possibility of over-diagnosis and over-medicalization. In that chapter, she also raises important issues about the commodification and politicalization of breast cancer: aspects that can (and routinely are) bracketed, but hardly can be considered irrelevant for a complete consideration of the breast cancer phenomenon and how to navigate it. Any disease, any condition affecting a significant population -- Cutter points out – leads to commodification, and knowledge is never apolitical. Conscious attempts to negate this are, for Cutter, political moves themselves.

To me the book's main shortcoming is its distance from scientific research and reflection on current emerging scientific practices understood as the processes by which scientists reach conclusions. Cancer research is producing so much conceptual innovation, for example, that it is a pity to have so little of that. A clear symptom of this is in the bibliography, where we find a very good selection of medical texts (both textbooks and normative), feminist philosophy (e.g., Elizabeth Anderson, Rosemarie Tong), sociology and history of medicine (notably, H.T. Engelhardt), classic philosophy (Aristotle, Plato, J.S. Mill, B. Pascal), textbooks in philosophy, ethics, cognitive science and decision making, but very few recent scientific articles, reviews and studies. About the biological nature and characteristics of breast cancer we only find the complete account of known associated genetic mutations, a detailed typology, and suggestions that breast cancer is a very complex phenomenon, triggering all the epistemological and cognitive processes that Cutter underlines. But what does it mean that "Currently, breast cancer is seen to be composed of mutated cells that result from abnormal processes that affect biological function in certain ways" (p. 131)? Very little elaboration is found on important topics such as this. Notably, by learning and reflecting on cancer research one could get the very same "intersections" that Cutter points to. Cancer is indeed a moving target, not just in the clinical sense, but also at the macro level of fundamental research. As a result, the goals and assumptions of cancer research exhibit continuous change, aspects of great stability, and signs of long-term progressive collective orientation: cancer resists any attempt of reduction to molecular features, there are no common genes or molecular targets identified as causally relevant or descriptive of the neoplastic cells. In fact, cancer is no longer seen as a gene-based disease: a growing multiplicity of explanatory models, factors and mechanisms are involved in explaining carcinogenesis. One cannot conceptualize cancer without considering at least two levels of biological organization -- e.g., the cell (individual) and the tissue (collective). However, since cancer is characterized by a breakdown or collapse of organization, "part-whole" relationships are themselves questioned. Empirical evidence and trends in the explanatory models point towards the peculiar dynamics that structure the organismic developmental process and organogenesis that actually get compromised in cancer: cancer is the disruption of the on-going process of coupling that structures biological development and growth.

Although probably beyond Cutter's aim, it is fair to say that the philosophical questioning that cancer provokes is much deeper than her book suggests. Yes, explaining the epistemological and philosophical implications of the ongoing revolution in cancer research would require a more thorough exploration from the scientific point of view. It is thus already fine -- for a patient, for example -- to reflect on how different universes of discourse (socializations, evaluations, descriptions, explanations, p. 130) are connected. Since relevance is a fundamental criterion for my philosophy of cancer, I think that demonstrating the relevance of philosophy for everyday life and worries is, indeed, a valuable task per se. A task that Cutter's work surely accomplishes.

This book is a very good read for patients, philosophers, and lay people interested in reflecting critically on medicine, breast cancer in particular. For a patient to understand that breast cancer is not a "clinical entity", "composed of physical matter, and reducible to its parts", but rather "a physical condition framed within prevailing frames of reference" (p. 46) is already a significant step. Philosophy allows us to identify and question the fundamental principles of our thought. There are different ways of being a realist and dealing with the mediated nature of knowledge (since the world gets to us mediated by our senses and our instruments). We don't always need to go after parts explaining all the properties and the very existence of wholes and comprehensive phenomena, but there are several positions for being reductionist and/or holist about a phenomenon. The types of breast cancer (e.g., DCIS, LCIS, IDC, ILC) that are described by Cutter, as well as the related molecular factors (e.g., HER2, ER+, PR+, mutations in BRCA1, BRCA2, PALB2) are there to be known and framed in an honest epistemology by all the actors involved: the researcher, the physician, the patients and their families. Explanations, predictions and treatments should not be merely interpreted by a cause-and-effect relation when dealing with breast cancer but, I would say, put in relation to a deeper understanding of human physiology and health in general. This, again, is an important attitude for anyone involved in a care process to adopt. I agree with Cutter and praise her work, as philosophy does provide the right tools to set up these problems properly. Also, clinical "evaluations" are such because they are, indeed, value-laden: aesthetic and ethical values intervene along with functional, instrumental, professional, and cultural values in the evaluation, something that goes unrecognized by a 'sterilized' view of medicine. No doubt recognizing in full this human aspect of science leads to more critical thinking when we deal with a complex disease like cancer.

[1] And it is not always clear whether Cutter is suggesting an integrative description of breast cancer (i.e., how we should look at it) or asserting that breast cancer has an integrative nature. Yes, we may say that the two are tightly related but I would say they do not fully coincide.