Thinking Through Feeling: God, Emotion and Passibility

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Anastasia Philippa Scrutton, Thinking Through Feeling: God, Emotion and Passibility, Continuum, 2011, 227pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441162755.

Reviewed by Stephen Chanderbhan, Canisius College


Among the classical attributes of God, particularly in the major western monotheisms, is impassibility. Given this attribute, God is said not to suffer passions, since doing so is to admit some imperfection in God. Examples of passions in the ancient Greek philosophical tradition include love, joy, anger, and so on. Many have thought that an impassible God does not have emotions. This makes situations in which God is said to have emotions, such as episodes related through a religious tradition's stories and scriptures, particularly difficult to explain. For impassibilists, the solution is to maintain impassibility and downplay the literal descriptions of those situations. Forpassibilists, the solution is to deny impassibility.

The dilemma here arises only if experiencing emotions entails suffering passions. This is not obviously true, however. On certain views, emotions are not always unbidden and unintelligent responses, as the term 'passion' seems to connote. In fact, it is claimed that some emotions may be integral to having some knowledge in certain cases. To lack emotion would be to lack some knowledge.

Anastasia Philippa Scrutton enters at the intersection of these debates about the nature of God and the nature of emotions. She employs both classical and contemporary sources to help bridge the gap between passibilists and impassibilists. In Thinking Through Feeling, she claims that the Augustinian/Thomist distinction between passionesand affectiones may help to show how even an impassible God can have emotions. In addition, she claims that a theist may want to say that God can have emotions, since emotions can be irreplaceable indicators of knowledge in certain cases. In what follows, I offer a brief summary of the major points of each chapter.

Chapters 1 and 2 are devoted to defending her first claim. In Chapter 1, Scrutton investigates why impassibility "seemed attractive and obvious to early Christian theologians, and what precisely they meant when they affirmed it." (12) At the outset, she notes that there is no ancient (or, for that matter, medieval) philosophical concept that maps perfectly onto contemporary characterizations of the concept 'emotion'. Rather, there is a cluster of terms used to describe emotion-like phenomena within particular metaphysical and ethical frameworks. Drawing on work by Thomas Dixon, she reports that talking about 'emotions' in ancient (and medieval) contexts is anachronistic, strictly speaking. Right away, she begins to build up evidence for her claim that a lack of passions (i.e., impassibility) does not immediately entail a lack of emotionality.

In her well-researched survey of early Christian attitudes towards passions, she claims that it was, rather, the passions' associations with passivity, irrationality, moral imperfection, and temporality that were problematic. Such properties of passions were contrary to other fundamental attributes of God, such as aseity, moral perfection, and eternity. She does report that some early theologians (e.g., Theophilius of Antioch, Lactantius, and Gregory Thaumaturgos) claimed that God could voluntarily choose to suffer passions and that this would, in fact, be a greater indication of God's omnipotence. Scrutton returns to this idea several times in the course of the book.

Just as the early church had an inclination towards impassibilism, she claims that contemporary theologians have had more of an inclination towards passibilism. Scrutton concludes Chapter 1 by investigating why this may be. One reason she cites is "a change in the concept of emotion" such that emotions "are seen to be potentially active, positive, rational, and even essential to wisdom and intelligence." (33) Since impassibility has seemed to entail that God lacks emotions, passibilism has been viewed as the relevant alternative.

In Chapter 2, Scrutton describes the distinction between passiones and affectiones (sing., affectus) in Augustine and Thomas Aquinas. She claims that this may be the key to an irenic solution between passibilists and impassibilists: a way in which an impassible God could have emotions. It is plausible, Scrutton says, to claim that both passionesand affectiones are what we would consider emotions today. For example, both affectiones and passiones are movements of appetitive powers. While passiones are said to be movements of the sensory appetite, affectiones are said to be similar kinds of movements of the "higher, intellective soul," or the will. (37) As they are movements of the will, they are also voluntary in some sense.

Since God has a mind and will, Augustine intimates that certain affectiones can be attributed to God, though he never says this in so many words. Aquinas adopts a similar distinction and is more explicit about claiming that God has such affectiones. He writes, "When love and joy and the like are ascribed to God or the angels . . . they signify simple acts of the will having like effects, but without passion."[1] Scrutton claims that Aquinas's distinction is similar to Augustine's. She also claims it is starker, though, owing to Aquinas's Aristotelian metaphysical predispositions. For example, Aquinas definitely associates corporeality with the passiones, but not the affectiones. Given this, experiencing emotions may not entail either imperfection or corporeality. For these reasons, among others, she thinks the Augustinian/Thomist distinction may prove useful.

Chapters 3 through 6 are devoted to defending her second claim -- that emotions can be indicative, or even revelatory, of knowledge in certain cases. In Chapter 3, Scrutton explores whether or not emotions are cognitive and, thus, potentially intelligent states. Cognitivism is the position that all emotions necessarily contain a cognitive component. It is widely thought that this cognitive component must consist of propositional attitudes, such as judgments and beliefs. Representative of this kind of view is Martha Nussbaum, according to whom, "emotions are judgments . . . Judgments are necessary for the emotions, and are sufficient for the emotion if they have the requisite eudaimonistic evaluative content." (58-59)

Those who think this requires too much for all emotions in all situations may be motivated to adopt a minimal non-cognitivist view, such as a hybrid account, according to which only some emotions are cognitive in the way Nussbaum describes while others are more "visceral and non-intellective." (65) Scrutton references Paul Griffiths's account of emotion, in which some emotions are the product of an almost automatic affect program, while others have a cognitive element much like Nussbaum's. Such an account, however, would do violence to the unity of the concept 'emotion', she worries, in a way that fails to appreciate the "family resemblances" among affective experiences. (66) She suggests that cognitivism can be saved by claiming that emotions may fall on a cognitive "spectrum or continuum." (66)

Scrutton then considers how emotions could possibly be cognitive and objective -- that is, responsive to the way things really are in the world, as opposed to the way we subjectively construe things to be. That is, might emotions "actually help us to perceive some value in the world?" (67) She uses an example from Raymond Gaita in which a team of psychiatrists and a nun both give intellectual assent to the same proposition about a group of patients in a psychiatric ward: namely, that these patients have irreducible dignity. The nun's interactions with the patients are suffused with affectivity, while the psychiatrists' pronouncements seemingly come from some psychic distance. According to Scrutton, this indicates something about the firmness, depth, and integration of the nun's belief as opposed to the psychiatrists' beliefs.

Granting that there is something true that both the nun and the psychiatrists are assenting to, Scrutton claims that the nun likely knows the value of those patients in a different, deeper way than the psychiatrists -- and this different, deeper way is irreducibly affective. Lacking the emotions, the nun's understanding of the patients' dignity would also be lacking. Analogously, she claims, it could be argued that God's understanding of certain states of affairs and truths might be lacking if God were to lack genuine emotions. As such, God would not be omniscient. Far from an imperfection, then, emotions would be a necessary component of God's perfection.

In Chapters 4, 5, and 6, Scrutton investigates three kinds of emotional responses -- compassion, anger, and jealousy, respectively -- to determine the conditions under which such emotions are trustworthy and irreplaceable indicators of value. She chooses these three emotions because they are attributed to God at least in the Old Testament. Further, each of these can originate from a sort of love for those towards whom the emotion is directed. Insofar as they are trustworthy and irreplaceable indicators of value, we might want to claim that God can and does have such emotions.

Scrutton claims that compassion is "characterized by a personally involved love" that is "devoid of the detached and condescending characteristics of pity." (99) This presupposes a kind of empathy, which she describes as "the imaginative reconstruction of another's feelings." (99) She claims that compassion "reveals that people matter deeply, . . . reveals the reason for morality, and . . . provides a form of knowledge of people's feelings that cannot be gained through non-empathic means." (100) Scrutton adapts the Aristotelian conception of compassion along lines suggested in Nussbaum's work. For example, she replaces Aristotle's requirement for compassion that one have a judgment of "similar possibility" with a requirement that one have a judgment of "eudaimonistic significance." (100) In this way, God could empathize with another without there being a relevant similar possibility to judge.

Anger is important, Scrutton claims, "as an aspect of God's love" and, interestingly, is "implicit in the notion of forgiveness, which involves 'giving up' or waiving of the right to resentment." (121) She draws upon Bishop Butler and Charles Griswold in giving an account of this. For example, I would not be compelled to forgive another person had that other person not done anything wrong. With respect to having been wronged, I may experience anger. Further, anger of a certain kind only arises insofar as I care about the slight or the person who slighted me to some extent. Because of God's love for humans, God gets angry at being wronged by humans; and it is those kinds of wrongs for which it makes sense for God to forgive humans.

Similarly, a virtuous kind of jealousy is born of love. Scrutton defines jealousy "in terms of belief (in the value of the beloved) and eudaimonistic content (the belief that the beloved is important to the subject's personal flourishing, and a desire to be united with them)." (137) This presupposes, again, a kind of "personally involved love," as opposed to a kind of disinterested benevolence. (137) Such a love also seems to entail vulnerability or need that cannot be filled on one's own, but only by the other. This is certainly a controversial claim when applied to God. Here, Scrutton offers Gregory Thaumaturgos's idea as a possible solution -- that God voluntarily chooses to be vulnerable and that this choice could be "an affirmation of divine omnipotence, rather than a privation of it." (132)

In Chapters 7 and 8, Scrutton explores the connection between emotions and the will and body, respectively. In Chapter 7, she challenges the idea that humans areinvariably vulnerable with respect to emotions. Here, she draws on the work of Robert Solomon, who has argued that humans are not always passive with respect to all emotions. Ultimately, humans can come to control some emotions some of the time in at least a dispositional way. This dispositional control consists of "cultivating and nurturing certain aspects of one's character that lend themselves to some experiences and not others, . . . developing strategies to cope with unwanted emotional propensities, and . . . putting oneself into (or else avoiding) certain situations." (151)

Following this, she argues against Robin Cook, who claims that the "subjective experience" of emotion seems "beyond our control," so the subjective experience of voluntarily chosen emotions, particularly suffering, will not be as authentic. (152) Scrutton investigates the possibility that suffering over which one retains reasonable voluntary control might still amount to real suffering by comparing two cases: a rich person trying to live in poverty for a time to see how the other half lives, so to speak, and a saint choosing to leave his life of luxury to minister to lepers. In both cases, she claims, suffering is voluntarily incurred. As these cases are described, the saint's suffering seems genuine, physical ailments notwithstanding; if nothing else, it seems more genuine than the rich person's suffering. What may account for the difference, she claims, are the antecedent motivations, attitudes, and commitments with which the saint enters his situation, as opposed to those of the rich person. Given this, she claims that there is reason to think that the subjective experience of voluntary suffering can be just as genuine as involuntary suffering.

In Chapter 8, Scrutton explores the need for emotions to have a particularly bodily component, much like the passiones that Aquinas describes. Her primary opponent here is Marcel Sarot, who claims that having strong emotions entails corporeality. Sarot claims that passibilists who want to ascribe certain strong emotions to God must conclude that God has a body; otherwise, they must reject passibilism and accept that God only experiences what he calls "weak" and "calm" emotions. (166) After an extensive discussion of the details of Sarot's position, Scrutton concludes that Sarot does not adequately argue for the claim that the feeling states involved with strong emotions are necessarily bodily feelings or sensations, as opposed to "mental feelings." (179) She also offers some arguments here against physiological reductionism, the thought that emotions are ultimately nothing more than their physiological components even in humans. In so doing, she motivates the claim that an incorporeal being could experience emotions, even as we understand emotions today.

Scrutton does not describe a thoroughgoing metaphysics of emotions in God in this book; I do not see this as her aim. Granted, her conclusion is that the Augustinian / Thomist distinction between passiones and affectiones could help us understand how an impassible God could have the kinds of emotions that might be uniquely revelatory of knowledge. Nevertheless, it is worth remarking that Scrutton does not restrict herself to an Augustinian or Thomistic metaphysical framework when she discusses emotions in the later chapters of the book. Certain ideas presented here, such as the claim that God might choose to suffer in some way, would need to be given an extensive explanation in such a framework. Further, Scrutton's insights about the need for emotions with respect to knowledge are particularly apt in human cases. At least on a Thomistic view, such claims could be made of God only by analogy, ultimately. Still, I think she offers a compelling case that certain strands of Augustinian and Thomistic thought are reflected in current scholarship on emotionality (e.g., the cognitive nature of affective states, the potential voluntariness of affective states, the role of the body in emotional experiences) and could help in adjudicating debates about God's emotionality.

A few specific comments. With respect to Aquinas's view of passiones (Chapter 2), Scrutton writes, "For Thomas, the question is whether the emotion is a movement of the will or not -- and this determines both whether an emotion is virtuous or vicious and whether it is a passion or an affect." (50) This seems to imply that only affectiones can be virtuous and that passiones are always vicious. On my reading of Aquinas, this is false. Aquinas thinks that passiones themselves can come under the control of reason.[2] As such, passiones themselves can be virtuous in some sense. He writes that a person may choose to be affected by a passio via a "judgment of . . . reason;" on account of this, he or she ends up working "more promptly" with "the co-operation of the sensitive appetite."[3] A person chooses to be affected by a passio, not anaffectus; the emotion itself is the movement of the sensitive appetite, not the will.

Also, Scrutton mentions in Chapter 3 that, perhaps, cognitivity could be measured on a kind of continuum. Remy Debes has developed a kind of scale like this. Debes describes three axes along which some mental state can be judged as more or less cognitive (the first extreme is characteristic of non-cognitive states, while the second is characteristic of cognitive states): opacity/transparency, automaticity/voluntariness, and encapsulation/integration with beliefs and judgments.[4]

Finally, a suggestion that I hope will be helpful. Perhaps Scrutton's discussion of compassion, empathy, and their integral roles in knowledge (at least in human cases) in Chapter 4 could benefit from material on the knowledge of persons and second-personal relationships. This has been the subject of considerable excitement recently in philosophy, neuroscience, and psychology. For example, Eleonore Stump's recent book, Wandering in Darkness: Narrative and the Problem of Suffering, includes a good amount of material on how a knowledge of persons, which she thinks is irreducible to 'knowledge that', can be had in second-personal contexts.[5]

In general, the writing in this book is very clear. The summaries after Chapters 2 and 6, respectively, are particularly helpful. Scrutton displays insight and skill in artfully weaving together several related strands of thought, and this breadth does not detract from her project's depth, by and large. Thinking Through Feeling is a timely book given the growing interest in emotions and their relationships to human rationality, morality, and flourishing. I think this has the kind of material that will spark fruitful research projects for philosophers and theologians (and perhaps even psychologists) alike.

[1] Thomas Aquinas, Summa theologiae (hence, ST) I-II, q. 22, a. 3, ad 3. The translation is from the Fathers of the English Dominican Province (New York: Benzinger Bros., 1920). All quotations from Aquinas in English are either from this translation or adapted from this translation unless otherwise noted. Cf. ST Ia, q. 82, a. 5, ad 1, which Scrutton (following Dixon) references on pg. 51.

[2] There is some debate about the mechanisms in Aquinas's psychology by which this control occurs: see Giuseppe Butera, "On Reason's Control of the Passions in Aquinas's Theory of Temperance," Mediaeval Studies 68 (2006): 133-160.

[3] ST I-II, q. 24, a. 3, ad 1.

[4] Remy Debes, "Neither here nor there: the cognitive nature of emotion," Philosophical Studies 146 (2009): 1-27. Here, he borrows from Jerry Fodor's descriptions of modular mental processes. Another very important and useful discussion of what being 'cognitive' means with respect to emotions may be found in Jesse Prinz, Gut Reactions: A Perceptual Theory of Emotion (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2004), particularly ch. 2 and its associated references.

[5] Eleonore Stump, Wandering in Darkness: Narrative and the Problem of Suffering (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2010), particularly chs. 4 and 6 and its associated references.