Thinking Through the Wissenschaftslehre: Themes from Fichte's Early Philosophy

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Daniel Breazeale, Thinking Through the Wissenschaftslehre: Themes from Fichte's Early Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2013, 460pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199233632.

Reviewed by Wayne M. Martin, University of Essex


Fichte's Wissenschaftslehre serves an existential as well as a scientific function, and the latter is in the service of the former. So runs a central thesis, and a central theme, of Daniel Breazeale's substantial and long-awaited book on Fichte's early (or 'Jena') philosophical system. That the Wissenschaftslehre has a scientific function is a point that Fichte often trumpets. In one of his preferred formulations, its task is to identify the ground or explanation of the system of representations that are accompanied by a feeling of necessity, and of the feeling of necessity itself. Elsewhere he emphasizes that its task is to identify "die Bestimmung des Menschen" -- the specific determination (or 'vocation') of man. On Breazeale's account, however, these scientific aims are in the service of an existential purpose that is perhaps best described as palliative. The Wissenschaftslehre is Fichte's "means for coming to terms with, and if possible, mitigating, the painful existential division within our own selves" (125).

That striking formulation of Fichte's ambition was first proposed by Breazeale twenty years ago, in a paper published in Fichte-Studien. Fichte-Studien, alas, is not on the shelves of every university library. But this book should be. Breazeale himself is the undisputed dean of Fichte scholarship in the English-speaking world, and among the most important commentators writing on Fichte in any language. Over the past four decades he has not only published scores of papers on Fichte, he has also translated the vast bulk of Fichte's Jena corpus into English, producing a series of masterful critical editions. Both through his own work, and though his influence on the broader scholarly project, he has improved exponentially both the quality and the quantity of primary and secondary material available on Fichte in English. The volume under review comprises fourteen of his papers, all of which were previously published in one form or another. But this is by no means simply a volume of collected essays. Like Fichte himself, Breazeale has not been content to leave his own earlier ideas alone. He has revisited and rethought all of these papers, and the reworking has in most instances led to substantial additions and revisions. The result is a book of great clarity and insight, the mature fruit of long reflection, and one that is really without equivalent in any language.

A memorable passage from the early correspondence provides an instructive glimpse of Fichte's existential project. Writing in the summer of 1795, Fichte was seeking a rapprochement with Jacobi, who would later denounce the Wissenschaftslehre as "nihilism." Fichte's letter includes a riff on the Genesis narrative, in a paragraph that concludes with this thought: "Presumption led us to philosophize, and this cost us our innocence. We caught sight of our own nakedness, and since then we have had to philosophize for our salvation." (Breazeale quotes this passage at 137, 263, 379; the mode of composition of the book does result in a certain amount of repetition). So why exactly are we in need of salvation, on Fichte's story, and how could something as obscure and technical as the Wissenschaftslehre serve such a function?

Breazeale's answer is framed in terms of "the divided self." Part of the human condition, on this accounting, is to find oneself torn. The division has a psychological manifestation (again and again Breazeale emphasizes the resulting pain), and seems also to have had biographical reality for Fichte himself (drawing on the earliest unpublished "night thoughts," Breazeale argues that Fichte's philosophical work was driven in no small part by personal anguish). But at its root, Breazeale argues, the division is ontological. There is, according to Breazeale's Fichte, "a division at the heart of man's very being as a free, finite agent acting within a spatio-temporal world" (134).

So what is this division, and how can the project of the Wissenschaftslehre provide any kind of help in coping with it? Breazeale characterizes it in a variety of interrelated ways. On one formulation, the division is between "theory and practice," or as Fichte sometimes puts it, between "head and heart." An essential part of human existence is that we both seek knowledge about the world and also act in it. According to Fichte, developing a theme from Kant's antinomies, this dual existence threatens a rupture, specifically with respect to human freedom. From our theoretical perspective, we treat all events, including human actions, as strictly determined; as agents, as Kant's famously puts it, "we act under the idea of freedom." For Fichte, the problem of free will is no mere intellectual puzzle. It puts us at odds with ourselves, with our most developed theoretical reflections threatening to make nonsense of our commitments as agents -- and vice versa. Breazeale: "[Man is] Torn between, on the one hand, the practical certainty of one's own freedom (or moral vocation) and, on the other, the equally undeniable feeling of constraint attendant upon one's empirical awareness of oneself as part and parcel of the natural world-order" (133).

Framed in these terms, one might expect that the "philosophical salvation" about which Fichte writes to Jacobi would take the form of some kind of compatibilism. If your existential suffering derives from the problem of free will, then the philosophy section of your local library is well-stocked with remedies that promise to ease the pain. It is surprising to see how little attention Fichte devotes to this option, particularly since Hume (arguably the grandfather of modern compatibilism) plays such an important role in Fichte's intellectual landscape, as Breazeale shows in his chapters on Aenesidemus (Ch. 2), Maimon (Ch. 3), and skepticism (Ch. 9). Breazeale finds a hint of quasi-rationalist "divine compatibilism" (8) in Fichte's very early book on religion, but the compatibilist theme in Hume's writings seems not to have made any impact on Fichte. Breazeale does at one point describe Fichte's transcendental idealist as "look[ing] for some way to reconcile the experienced passivity of the intellect with the practical certainty of his own freedom or capacity for self-determination" (249). But as we shall see, the reconciliation (such as it is) is highly attenuated, and informed by deeply incompatibilist commitments.

One possible source of those commitments comes into view with a second framing of the existential division: the tug-of-war between autonomy and heteronomy. Sometimes this contrast is framed in Kantian terms as a division between pure moral reason and heteronomous passions. Human nature exhibits "an unstable combination of rationality and sensibility" (345); the result is strife in the human soul. But this familiar and ancient description of the human struggle sits alongside something distinctively modern and idiosyncratically Fichtean. The telltale sign can be found in the particular way in which the drive for autonomy is framed. As Breazeale puts it, the Fichtean I is "predetermined to will independence and self-sufficiency as the ultimate end of all acting and as the norm for evaluating particular, concrete courses of action" (179, emphasis added). Moreover, the Fichtean conception of self-sufficiency [Selbständigkeit] requires that the I "establish [its] independence and freedom . . . from any source of external determination" (348, emphasis added).

It is worth pausing to reflect on just how extreme this position really is. The ancient Cynics and Stoics were agreed in placing a very high value on self-sufficiency [αὐτάρκεια], but its value was in large part instrumental. If I am dependent on other things or other people for my happiness, then my happiness is to that extent fragile and vulnerable. Cultivating self-sufficiency is thus a strategy to secure happiness and insure against contingencies that might result in ethical harm. Kant had of course made autonomy a central principle of ethics, but he did not treat autonomy as itself the ultimate end in action. For Kant the ultimate end was the summum bonum, understood as a combination of happiness and virtue. The Fichtean position on autonomy seems to be much more extreme -- so extreme that it merits a name all its own. Let's call it autono-mania. Autonomy is not simply a value, or an important or central value in human existence; it is the final aim of all action, and requires an absence of determination by anything other than oneself.

It should be clear that autono-maniacs cannot be satisfied by any run-of-the-mill compatibilism. The compatibilist characteristically tries to show how freedom can exist alongside determination by something other, but the autono-maniac refuses this option from the outset. It should also be clear that autono-maniacs are doomed to frustration and humiliation in every interaction with the world. For of course every interaction with other objects or other persons must of necessity involve a degree of determination by something else. My trajectory through space is determined by that of the planet on which I happen to reside. The language I speak is not self-legislated but inherited. Even the act of rational scientific judgement requires that our representing and judging be determined by the evidence, as Fichte himself insists. So the ideal of thoroughgoing, self-determining self-sufficiency is beyond the reach of any finite entity. If human beings are constitutionally committed to such an ideal and yet at the same time essentially embedded in a natural world and society that they do not control, the human situation will indeed be beset by painful division and disappointment.

It is important to emphasize the conditional form of the preceding sentence. If you are an autono-maniac then you are doomed to painful conflict in your encounters with the world. This itself suggests one natural existential therapy. If autono-mania is the essential ingredient in existential suffering, then perhaps autono-mania is itself pathological. (Here it is worth remembering that the delusion of being God is one of the canonical forms of psychosis in schizophrenia.) By scaling back on the commitment to autonomy and self-sufficiency (for example by treating it as one rival good to be balanced with others) the autono-maniac might hope to escape perpetual suffering in every interaction with the world. Alas, scaling back seems not to have been a modality with which Fichte was familiar.

It should be clear that the concept of freedom is the thread that unites all this. On at least seven separate occasions Breazeale quotes an early letter in which Fichte describes the Wissenschaftslehre as providing "the first system of freedom." In a later letter Fichte tells Reinhold that his philosophy is, "from the beginning to the end, an analysis of the concept of freedom" (cited at 373n38). In light of this advertising, it seems fair to ask: what exactly is Fichte's account of freedom? It is clear that he is committed to freedom; he is also viciously critical of those who propose to explain it away as some kind of illusion. And it is clear that he proposes to treat freedom as, in some sense, the first principle and animating spirit of his philosophical system. But what does Fichte actually think it means to be free? Here we come to the first of two surprising lacunae in Breazeale's book: it includes no chapter devoted to this topic. Like the reader of Fichte's own corpus, Breazeale's readers are left to piece together this "concept of freedom" from various dispersed leads and clues.

One important piece of the puzzle concerns Fichte's use of the term "the I" [das Ich]. I have referred above to "the Fichtean I," but on Breazeale's analysis, this expression harbors a systematic ambiguity. In one sense, the Fichtean I is the unconditionally self-positing, autonomous subject. The invocation of such a subject famously serves as the first principle of the first systematic presentation of the Wissenschaftslehre: "The I posits itself unconditionally and absolutely [schlechthin]." Both Fichte and Breazeale use a variety of terms in referring to it: "the infinite I," "the absolute I," "the pure I." But according to Breazeale, this unconditionally self-positing I is to be distinguished sharply from the empirical, individual subject (the finite I). Unlike the pure I, the human subject is always limited, always finite, neither absolute nor unconditioned. (See in particular Chapter 7, on "The Finitude of the I.")

To this we can add a critical second result emphasised by Breazeale. Newsflash: There is no such thing as an absolute I. Indeed, on Fichte's view, an absolute I is an impossibility. "Finite I's are the only I's there are. The 'absolute I' is either a philosopher's fiction, a hypothesis that is shown to subvert itself . . . or else it is a mere idea of reason" (103). This claim may well come as a surprise to those who learned their German Idealism from the histories of philosophy (whether from Hegel or Royce in the 19th century, Russell or Coplestone in the 20th, or Adrian Moore in the 21st). In this respect, Breazeale's whole line of interpretation is decisively influenced by Alexis Philonenko, who once described the strategy of the Wissenschaftslehre as "beginning with what is false" (quoted at 112n43). Of course we must be careful not to overstate this important point. It is certainly true that the concept of the absolute or unconditionally self-positing I occupies a place in Fichte's philosophical system. But it does not do so in anything like the mode of a direct metaphysical commitment.

But if Fichte denies that there is an absolutely self-positing I, then what exactly is the place of this notion in his philosophical position? The task of articulating Fichte's theory of freedom is in no small part the task of answering this question. On Breazeale's reconstruction, there is a sense in which the absolute I, although not something real, is nonetheless operative within the human subject: "if idealism is correct, then the pure I with which it begins and whose necessary acts and laws it describes, must be actively present in every human being, and therefore everyone must already in some sense 'possess the concept' of the free I" (329). This in turn is related to a theme that Breazeale repeatedly emphasizes, viz., that one can only get started on Fichte's philosophical system if one is already in possession of "a lively awareness of one's own freedom" (111; see also 145, 234n10, 313, et passim).

So what can it mean to say that the pure (absolutely self-positing) I is "actively present" in every human being? And what is "the concept of the free I" that every individual thereby finds within herself? Presumably the pure I does not inhabit the finite I as some kind of internal homunculus; so what are the alternatives? To answer these questions it helps to start by considering what Breazeale calls the "extra-philosophical or pre-philosophical presupposition" (111) that Fichte establishes as a prerequisite for every would-be student of the Wissenschaftslehre. What exactly were the auditors of Fichte's Jena lectures meant to have a lively awareness of?

As a first approximation, Breazeale's answer seems to be: one's own status or standing as an agent. That itself implicates certain phenomenological data. There is something that we might call the subjective experience of acting. (Hey; I did that! That was my doing!) There is also what Kant describes as the fact of reason: the experience of being the addressee of certain unconditional normative demands. (Hey; there is something that is required of me!). In both cases Breazeale treats these facts of consciousness as the phenomenal manifestation of an intellectual intuition (the topic of Ch. 8), in virtue of which we are pre-discursively acquainted with our own activities as acting and representing subjects. It is only because this pre-discursive awareness is already at work in the finite I that the philosopher is in a position to reflect on it though an act of abstraction.

Fichte himself certainly recognized that these phenomenological data do not settle the question of freedom. After all, it is open to the skeptic to acknowledge the phenomena, but to explain them away as systematic illusions or deceptions. You may feel yourself to be the author and source of your intentions, but there is no guarantee of the accuracy of such a feeling. Part of what is distinctive about the Fichtean position is not simply the discovery of these data, but the idea that human subjectivity consists, in part, in a distinctive (and distinctively uncompromising) commitment to them. Here we can identify at least one element of Fichte's notorious "act of annihilation" of one of his persistent critics. If indeed a commitment to one's status as a free agent is a constituent of subjectivity, and if Professor Schmid has indeed renounced such a commitment on the basis of some physical or metaphysical doctrine, then it follows that Professor Schmid does not exist -- or at least does not exist as a subject.

It is important to emphasize that this commitment to one's status as a self-determining agent is not a commitment that is undertaken consciously and deliberately at a particular moment in time -- in the way that one might commit to a marriage or to a cause or to a job. If we are to make sense of Fichte's position, then we need to see that the commitment to agency is something that we discover in ourselves as, in effect, always already having happened. In every judgement and in every action, part of what is already at work is my claiming title to the status of judge and agent. Because this status-claim has always already happened, it is, in effect, inalienable. I can never renounce it without, in the very act of renunciation, remounting the very claim that I purport to renounce. Moreover, on Fichte's view, it is something that I ought not renounce, since to abandon my status as an agent would be contrary to the requirements of duty.

This is perhaps a suitable place to mention the second surprising lacuna in Breazeale's book: the absence of any systematic explanation of the meaning of the term "to posit" (setzen). The concepts of positing and self-positing figure in almost every claim that Fichte has to make about anything, but the concept itself is far from clear. If we were to press Breazeale for an explanation, I suspect that his answer would take the form of a meticulously evidenced catalog of the variety of different ways in which Fichte uses the term. At 409, Breazeale seems to treat "posits itself" as equivalent to "is aware of itself." At 411 he uses "posits" interchangeably with "knows," and at 228 as interchangeable with "thinks." On at least two occasions (251, 424) he suggests that Fichtean positing is a kind of assertion -- a suggestion that has also recently been advanced by Adrian Moore, who warns against understanding self-posting as a form of self-causing or self-production. These last suggestions strike me as being on the right track. Developing the ideas in the preceding paragraph, we might think of self-positing as something like staking a claim to a status. Such a claim might be made explicit in particular circumstances (for example in asserting one's rights, demanding recognition, taking responsibility, etc.), but the primary phenomenon is implicit, preconscious, pre-discursive -- and always already at work in every exercise of subjectivity. For Fichte, self-positing in this sense is indeed schlechthin (unconditional, absolute): the finite I makes a claim about itself and its freedom that it cannot, will not, and ought not surrender. But notice that this leaves open the question of whether that claim is true.

It is not entirely clear to me that Breazeale can sign on to this account of the meaning of "self-positing," however, if only because of the prima facie contradiction it creates with the Philonenko position that he also seems to endorse. If the absolute I (infinite I, pure I) is the I that posits itself unconditionally and absolutely [schlechthin], and if self-positing is understood as the mounting of a claim to the status of being an I, and if Fichte holds that an inalienable claim upon such a status is always already at work in every individual (finite) subject, then it turns out that Fichte does after all think that there is an absolute I. You are one, and so am I. Perhaps the best way out of this looming contradiction would be to treat "self-positing" as a term with an evolving meaning in the context of the Wissenschaftslehre. This is a matter that merits further investigation.

Setting that difficult matter aside, however, we are now coming to the point where we can trace the shape of Breazeale's Fichtean diagnosis of the existential pain from which we suffer. The two essential elements would seem to be as follows. (1) The principle of the absolute or pure I is "actively present in us" as finite subjects insofar as each of us constitutionally stakes a claim to the status of 'I-hood' in a sense that requires free, self-determining agency. But (2) every finite individual I fails to fulfill this claim, insofar is it is always limited and determined by something that is not-I. The result is a form of failure that is endemic to the being of the finite subject and that is liable to manifest itself in existential pain or anguish. It turns out that Woody Allen was right all along. For an I, life is ultimately disappointing.

It seems to me that the vulnerable point in this despairing diagnosis lies in its second proposition. Why should we conclude that our claim to the status of agency is always and ever a losing gambit? Fichte's answer, if I understand Breazeale correctly, turns on the point we explored above: Fichte understands agency in terms of autonomy, and he understands autonomy in terms that require freedom from determination by anything else. Fichte's diagnosis, as Breazeale reconstructs it, thus comes to depend on a substantive philosophical thesis, viz., that there is something incipiently autono-maniacal about agency or I-hood as such. As Fichte puts the point in his System of Ethics: I discover in myself a drive to absolute self-activity.

One might take the view that Fichte has nothing to offer in defense of this contention, or that the resources he has are not discursively articulable. One of the themes both in Fichte's writings and in Breazeale's is the thought that, in the end, there is some essentially intimate acquaintance with one's own free agency that must simply be recognized and acknowledged. It can never be proved if it is doubted or produced if it is absent; at most it can be fostered and solicited through forms of education and spiritual development. (This was the thesis of Breazeale's important early paper, "How to Make an Idealist," which forms the basis of Ch. 11.) But even while acknowledging this theme, and the importance of the point, we must remember that the critical issue at this stage in the dialectic does not concern my acquaintance with my own sense of agency or my answerability to inescapable normative requirements. Nor is it simply a matter of my practical-existential commitment to a self-conception as agent. The hard nut lies in Fichte's distinctive unpacking of this sense of agency in terms of the commitment or aspiration to absolutely self-sufficient autonomy. If Fichte has nothing to say in defense of that thesis, then it becomes all-too-easy to dismiss his account of freedom as either adolescent or pathological -- or both.

But Breazeale maintains that Fichte does have something to say in defense of this point, and he undertakes to reconstruct that defense in one of the densest and most difficult passages of the book (176-183), in a section devoted to Fichte's variant on Kant's categorical imperative. This itself is an important point in its own right. On Breazeale's reconstruction, autono-mania does not figure in the Wissenschaftslehre merely as some sort of datum of consciousness or unargued first postulate. It emerges, rather, in the context of a series of derivations, and these come specifically in the context of Fichte's moral philosophy. I cannot here attempt to reconstruct all the detail of Breazeale's subtle interpretation, but confine myself to the point that bears directly on the existential diagnosis.

The derivation can be divided into three stages. We start from the fact that the I posits itself as an I, staking a claim to its own status as a free agent. In order to make good on this claim, the I must effect a change in the world; it must "act efficaciously." But this alteration of the world only genuinely fulfills the original gambit if the change is the result of the I's concept of an end, and not the result of some external cause. Here is the key passage from Breazeale:

Willing always has as its end some modification of the external world. What is distinctive about modifications brought about by freely willing, in contrast with those brought about by natural causality, is that the ground of the former lies within the I itself and not in any object. (178)

It is on this basis that Breazeale then explicitly draws the conclusion with which we are concerned: "By means of this series of derivations we have now discovered the 'original determination' of any finite rational being whatsoever: namely its determination to determine itself, independently of any outside influence" (178-79).

My concern is that this "series of derivations" seems to turn on a false disjunction. The pivotal thesis comes with Breazeale's claim (on Fichte's behalf) that "the ground of the former [i.e., the ground of modifications wrought by free willing] lies within the I itself and not in any object" (emphasis added). I can't myself see how the final clause in this requirement is justified. Suppose that a series of natural causes turns an artic river into ice, and that through heroic effort an artist then transforms it into an ice hotel, relying on the persistently frigid weather in fulfilling her long-standing ambition. I cannot myself see why the fact that the ice hotel has some essential natural causes in any way detracts from its claim upon the status: product of free willing. Don't get me wrong. I can certainly see that there might be grounds to doubt whether the ice hotel was genuinely a product of the artist's freedom. (Perhaps the whole idea of the ice hotel was implanted in the artist's subconscious by Leonardo DiCaprio in exchange for money; the freedom of the accomplishment might then seriously be in doubt.) What I can't see is that the mere fact of the involvement of natural causes could suffice to impugn its credentials. Yet it is precisely that thought that seems to underwrite Fichte's despairing diagnosis, and his refusal of the usual compatibilist consolations.

But suppose that we grant Fichte his diagnosis of our existential pain. What then does he have to offer by way of treatment? It should be clear that there can be no cure, per se, if indeed the pain of the divided self is endemic to the distinctive mode of being of beings like us. So what is the appropriate therapy? According to Breazeale, Fichte's palliative proposal seems to be: study the Wissenschaftslehre!

The thought behind this surprising suggestion is essentially as follows. The Wissenschaftslehre begins from the idea of a pure self-positing free I. What it goes on to show is that the very possibility of such self-positing depends on a series of further conditions. There must be a finite I that encounters a check that it does not itself control, and it must then have an opportunity to work on a partially recalcitrant world in order to fulfill its claim to agency. Furthermore, the very possibility of realizing that agency depends on its existence alongside and in community with others, who themselves rightly demand that the I recognize limits on its own freedom in acknowledgement of their rights. In short, the essential conditions on what the I posits -- its own existence as an absolute I -- include the fact that it is not, and can never be, such an I. Breazeale:

Fichte's Jena Wissenschaftslehre is in fact a merciless and uncompromising exposé of the vanity of the "absolutely self-positing I" and a heroic attempt to demonstrate -- starting from the presumptive perspective of just such an autonomous and self-sufficient subject -- the utter untenability of such a claim. (187)

One might have thought that such a result provides us with good reason to abandon the original posit -- save for the fact that, if Fichte is correct, that original act of self-positing is an inalienable feature of our mode of being as subjects. So what the Wissenschaftslehre offers instead is a form of self-comprehension. We will not be able to eliminate the existential dissatisfaction that is our distinctive fate, but we can understand it and its source, and appreciate the extent to which it is both inevitable and indeed self-imposed. This itself might reasonably be expected to produce a certain palliative effect: pain that is self-imposed characteristically hurts less. But more importantly, it produces what we might call existential orientation. Breazeale himself at several points describes the intended outcome as a form of reconciliation (151, 152, 187): our existential suffering may be inevitable, but it is not senseless; our situation is therefore "neither tragic nor absurd" (150).