Thinking with Images: An Enactivist Aesthetics

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John M. Carvalho, Thinking with Images: An Enactivist Aesthetics, Routledge, 2018, 159pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138616028.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Strayer, Purdue University Fort Wayne


This slim volume makes a novel contribution to philosophy of art and philosophical aesthetics. It may also be read with appreciation by artists, art critics, art historians, and members of the artworld in general. Carvalho's book is about how to think about art, but a general epistemological thesis stated at the beginning of the book, and repeated with some frequency, is that, "We really begin to think when we do not know what to think." This kind of mental activity is thought ungoverned by rules or patterns of thinking that might be customarily used in an attempt to achieve understanding. Although it is not said to constitute whatever the essence of thinking might be, it is a kind of thought that can be provoked by certain works of art, including those here considered. Three of these are Francis Bacon's Study after Velázquez's Portrait of Pope Innocent X (1953), Marcel Duchamp's Étant donnés: 1° la chute d'eau, 2° le gaz, d'éclairage (1946-1966), and Jean-Luc Godard's Le Mépris or Contempt (1963). The fourth case study considers a number of photographs by Duane Michals, including Things Are Queer (1973) and René Magritte Asleep (1965). That all of the works cited, and others like them, resist immediate understanding is maintained by the author to be part of their interest and value. Thinking about an artwork caused by not knowing what to think is said to be of particular interest to philosophers, and to thinkers in general, who are enlarged intellectually and existentially in their confrontation with uncertainty. The kind of merit that can be found in difficult art is value that Bertrand Russell found in philosophy (pp. 9-10), and it seems certain to have motivated Carvalho to write the book.

Each work thought by Carvalho to resist quick or direct comprehension is a work of visual art, and so is something that must be seen for the challenge to thought to occur. No rule is available for understanding such difficult works of art, and the correct approach to reflecting on them is to think with images. Carvalho tells us that he "will take thinking generally to be a form of embodied active cognition" (p. 3) and he further says the thinking that we do when we do not know what to think is a kind of "embodied active cognition." (p. 3). He subscribes to enactivism, which is "an ecology of mind" in which mind, body, and environment are not distinct but continuous. Although he recognizes that an enactivist theory of mind is controversial, he thinks it is the best theory of mind that we have, and that it is better suited than other views to understanding works of art that are hard to comprehend. Body and environment are reciprocally interactive, and the continuity of mind and body, and the dependence of mind on body, mean that things can provide possibilities for human action that, citing work by Alva Noë and J. J. Gibson, are termed "affordances." Affordances are "the possibilities for actions provided by things," (p. 3) and of course any artwork of any kind of artwork is a thing of some kind of thing, no matter how much it deviates from tradition.

Carvalho recommends giving up broad theorizing about art, and even reflection on developed art forms, such as painting, to concentrate attention on individual works of art, such as those that he considers in this book. This is the sort of retreat from aesthetic theory recommended by Morris Weitz and Timothy Binkley in the analytic world, as well as from "the theories that emerged from a continental refashioning of political economy, psychoanalysis, feminism, and the like" (p. 21) The reason for this is that such theory "distracts our attention from the concrete materiality of the work of art." (p. 21) Although theory can inform one's approach to art, what is not appropriate to its appreciation and understanding is "any particular theory that threatens to be the only theory and every theory that would ignore the work of art for the purposes of aggrandizing theory itself." (p. 23) Such theory is pernicious in obstructing true artistic appreciation and understanding, and the correct approach means that "each artwork or group of related artworks [should be evaluated] on its own terms." (p. 12)

This concern with, and tailored approach to, the particularity of individual works is called "thinking with images." (p. 3) This kind of thought is distinguished from interpretation because he is more concerned with how an artwork makes him think rather than with trying to arrive at a final or conclusive meaning for a work. Given that the meaning of an artwork can be shaped not only by artistic intentions and prior art history, but by what comes after the work, one wonders if arriving at a definitive meaning for a work is possible. Carvalho apparently recognizes this when he states that "the creation and appreciation of [artworks] are all richly contextual." (p. 14) But if that is the case, then it is not immediately clear what would separate thinking about a work from interpreting a work. And as the context of creation and appreciation is shaped by knowledge and experience, two contexts can differ by a difference of knowledge that separates them in addition to time. The more pressing concern, though, is to understand exactly what it means to think with images, especially as the thinkers to which challenging art is said to appeal seem likely to think with words or purely imageless thoughts, and may rarely, if ever, think with pictures or images, even about visual works of art.

Thinking with images about art includes recognizing "what artistic problems artists confronted in the making of their work." (p. 13) This recognition is of particular importance because one then approaches attempted understanding of the work as if in the position that the artist was in when work on the work began. In confrontation with the work itself one thinks about how the artist might have thought, and imagines creative decisions that might have been made in an attempt to solve any artistic problem to which it is addressed. As a result, the work imposes itself on the one attending to it rather than being assessed in relation to a prior general theory. In thinking with images then, attention is directed to the works themselves. This approach to works, and especially to intellectually challenging works, is more valuable than approaching works in terms of existing theory, whether of art in general, or of an art form in particular. Thinking with images recognizes the materiality of art insofar as one has to pay attention to things like "materials, the manner of their application, point of view, cropping and framing, development, lighting and shadow, conditions of exhibition, and so on." (p. 14). This emphasizes the point, seen above, that the person thinking about art must think about it the way that the artist who produced it had to think in confronting such issues. Carvalho's desire for artworks to be thought about a posteriori in relation to the things that they actually are rather than a priori in terms of a theory about art or art forms is germane to an age when too many writers about art take their eyes off the works of art themselves and write all the way around them, so to speak, without attending to the work, or series of works, that the writing is meant to concern.

Thinking about art, especially work that is challenging enough that we do not know what to think about it, is complex and difficult. Accordingly, thinking about such work through the use of images recognizes that this approach to art is bettered by acquiring a repertory of skills for contemplating art, much as an artist's sharpening her artistic abilities and knowledge make her bettered prepared to create interesting and valuable art. How we become better adapted to thinking about challenging works of art "results from our skillful engagement with what is materially and discursively afforded by those works of art." (p. 17) Again, the kind of theory that directs attention away from the particularity of works is an unwanted diversion, and it is "When we focus on the material materials and practices relevant to the making and appreciating of a work of art" (p. 21) that the work becomes potentially a source of meaning and value.

Carvalho's analyses of the works of art he writes about  here are complex and resist easy summary. There likely will be points made about works with which the reader will agree and others with which she will disagree. In any case, they are pertinent, erudite, and informative, which makes them worthy of reading and reflection.

A few questions and comments: The title of this book is Thinking with Images, so it would be good to know exactly what does and does not count as an image. Each work entertained by Carvalho consists of a constructed image(s), or consists of images that have a causal relation to recognizable things in reality. What about a work, such as a late Turner, in which the distinction between image and abstraction is not always apparent? Does one use thinking with images in this sort of artistic reflection? Can one use imagistic thinking in pondering a work, such as a mature Malevich or Mondrian, that is purely abstract? Some of the more intellectually demanding works in the history of art are works of linguistic Conceptual art. Can words count as images? If so, how do they differ or relate to a more standard recognizable image? If not, how are such works to be understood?

We saw above that an affordance is a possibility for action that is provided by a thing, such as an artwork. The notion of an action here presumably includes thinking as a rationally intended occurrence. As such, the notion is not exhausted by the concept of bodily action, and a somatic action relevant to art may only have importance in relation to the seeing and thinking that are necessary conditions of its being an object of consideration. As most works of art do not invite any bodily action beyond any that puts a thinker in relation to the work to be understood, this is important to recognize. It is not clear, for instance, how the embodied view of mind and action will neatly fit appreciating and responding to a work such as Duchamp's Étant donnés, since although the wooden door, its enclosing brick frame, and the small room that contains them is a space in which a human body can fit and, to a limited extent, operate, few works in the history of art actually seem better suited to taking a Cartesian perspective of seeing and thinking about what is seen. This is because the relevance of the body to the work virtually disappears as one peers, as though disembodied, through two holes in the door that prevents entering the space of the objects seen, and so limits possible engagement with the installation beyond the seeing and thinking linked to this kind of ostensible mind-body separation. And it is not clear that a different philosophy of mind would be incompatible with the view that we truly begin to think about a work of art when we do not know what to think about it.

In writing about Bacon's Study after Velázquez's Portrait of Pope Innocent X, Carvalho says that Bacon is keen to focus on appearance in this painting -- itself an appearance of an appearance -- and that "Bacon hopes to make the image more artificial, even brutally distorted, if in this distortion the subject can be read as an appearance." (p. 46) The purpose of this distorted appearance, according to Carvalho, is to reach something that the observer "has bottled up or rendered indistinct for the purposes of living an unperturbed life," (p. 46) and that Bacon "is not looking to picture the miraculous in the mundane but the profane in the present." Good points. I do not think that one can look at such a work and not think about what some would term 'the horror of existence.' (And why no mention of Munch's The Scream in this context?) It could also be argued that Bacon has used this image to picture the terror caused by the conjecture that all is image, and that beneath any surface seen there is no depth, no meaning, no substance, no future. In addition, I think that the vertical stripes painted to suggest an ambiguous relation of the human figure to the curtain and the space in which it is pictured could be seen to comment pictorially on the earlier attention to surface in certain abstract artworks, and perhaps to anticipate the importance of "flatness and the delimitation of flatness" for Greenberg's Modernist painting. I state these observations only to agree with Carvalho about how knowledge brought to an encounter with a work helps us to think about it, and not to suggest some deficiency in his consideration of the work.

Other questions relevant to thinking of artworks include: What is the relation of title to work? A photograph titled René Magritte Asleep will not be viewed as it would have been had the identity of the person sleeping not been provided. Carvalho, in writing about Contempt, recognizes the important difference between seeing a projection of the film in a theatre, as intended by Godard, and seeing it at home on a DVD. This invites the general consideration for all art of how thinking with images can or should function in relation to any sort of copy of an original work. Can a copy of the original be said, in general, to excite thinking with images in a productive fashion, or does this have to be assessed on an individual basis? One really gets nothing of artistic or intellectual importance from viewing Marcel Duchamp's Bottle Rack in a museum that cannot be gotten from a reproduction, and perhaps even from knowing how the work was produced. In fact, that seems to be part of the conceptual value of the readymades. Finally, I am quite sympathetic to the view of the importance of challenging works of art, and their interest to philosophers and intellectuals in general. I think, however, it is entirely possible, and in fact happens, that a thinker might want to be seduced by the appeal of artworks that are thought to be beyond language -- works that, in some sense, defeat thought in the attempt to think about them. To become transfixed by an original work of art in viewing it, a Rothko, say, can be something of appeal to everyone, including thinkers.

This book could be used as part of a graduate or undergraduate course in philosophy of art, or in a course focused on art criticism and its relation to theory. I think, though, that it will be of greatest interest to professionals in the worlds of art and of philosophy.