Thinking with Kant's Critique of Judgment

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Michel Chaouli, Thinking with Kant's Critique of Judgment, Harvard University Press, 2017, 312pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674971363.

Reviewed by Samantha Matherne, University of California, Santa Cruz


Michel Chaouli offers an eloquent yet honest apology for Kant's third Critique, defending its continued value in the face of criticism from many sides. And the sides are, indeed, many. Over and above the general difficulty of Kant's language, many of the key terms around which Kant builds his theory of aesthetic experience, like 'beauty', 'taste', and 'pleasure', can seem outdated. More hostility still is garnered by his imperious-sounding claim that judgments of taste are 'universal' and 'necessary'. Even among those more sympathetic to his view, there arise concerns over Kant's formalism and the coherence of his analysis of the beauty of nature and art. What is more, these are only concerns internal to his aesthetics. Still other criticisms have been posed in relation to broader issues in the third Critique, like why Kant sees fit to combine an analysis of beauty with biology and how this could possibly help bridge the 'great chasm' between nature and freedom.

Though sensitive to these criticisms, Chaouli argues that it would be a mistake to let them deter us from taking the third Critique seriously. Instead, he claims, if we 'think with' the third Critique in a way that is at once sympathetic and critical, then we will gain important insight into the distinctive nature of aesthetic experience. In this spirit, Chaouli offers a comprehensive interpretation of the third Critique that involves "wiping the dust off" Kant's seemingly outmoded concepts, "removing the malignancy" from his seemingly coercive claims, and finding a place for beauty and biology, nature and art (43).

Before turning to the content of Chaouli's interpretation, a note on his style. He writes in a way that makes the third Critique accessible to those, whether in philosophy, literature, or art, who are less familiar with it. Accordingly, Chaouli's commentary differs from many of the more standard ones in philosophy in that he aims neither to offer a systematic reconstruction of Kant's views, nor to become entrenched in debates in secondary literature. Although he certainly addresses some of Kant's key moves and some secondary literature, his main goal is to work through the broad concepts in the third Critique in a textually and phenomenologically sensitive way. Nevertheless, in so doing, he defends an original interpretation of Kant's aesthetics that bears on many of the most contentious issues in the philosophical literature. For these reasons, his book should be of interest to both those new to and those steeped in the third Critique.

Chaouli divides his book into three parts. In Parts I ("Beauty") and II ("Art"), he explores issues that arise in relation to Kant's analysis of aesthetics in the first half of the third Critique. Central to Chaouli's argument here is the thesis that Kant offers a unified account of the percipient's experience of beauty, on the one hand, and the artist's production of art, on the other. I address this claim in detail below. In Part III ("Nature"), Chaouli addresses topics concerning Kant's theory of the teleological judgment of organisms in the second half of the third Critique. In this discussion, Chaouli suggests that although Kant's analysis of biology is not 'indispensible' for understanding his theory of aesthetic experience, it is valuable on, at least, two fronts. First, it can help deepen our grasp of important concepts in Kant's aesthetics, like 'purposiveness' and 'life'. Second, he claims that Kant's teleological views are of 'intrinsic' interest insofar as they point toward a still compelling account of natural teleology, which is grounded ultimately not in ontological facts about organisms, but rather in the structure of our own minds.

In what follows, I set aside many of the rich details of Chaouli's interpretation and take my cue instead from his opening idea: "We come to the Critique of Judgment to deepen our understanding of aesthetic experience" (3). Accordingly, I will focus primarily on the theory of aesthetic experience that he develops in Parts I and II.

As noted above, one of Chaouli's central claims is that Kant presents a unified account of the percipient's experience of beauty and the artist's creation of works of art. More specifically, he maintains that, on Kant's view, both the percipient and the artist are engaged in a productive activity, a "way of making," that rests on a unique form of freedom, viz., the freedom of play (xv). On Chaouli's reading, then, creativity, indeed, poetry belongs not just to Kant's creation aesthetic, but his reception aesthetic as well.

In order to defend this position, Chaouli advocates for a progressive reading of Kant's theory of aesthetic experience as something that he develops throughout the first half of the third Critique. Accordingly, Chaouli suggests that Kant's account of aesthetic experience in the Analytic of the Beautiful, an account that privileges 'pure' judgments of taste and beauty in nature, represents only the 'skeleton' of Kant's view (94). In order to understand Kant's full-blooded theory of aesthetic experience, he maintains we must attend to the ways Kant deepens his view of aesthetic experience, particularly in his discussion of beauty and morality and in his theory of fine art and genius. Chaouli claims that following the development of Kant's thought along these lines reveals that it is, in fact, not pure, but rather more complicated modes of aesthetic experience and the beauty of art that get us to the heart of Kant's theory.

Even in the Analytic, however, Chaouli suggests, we get hints of Kant's commitment to the creativity of aesthetic experience. To this end, in his analysis of Kant's account of disinterested pleasure in the First Moment of Taste in Chapter 1, Chaouli argues that, for Kant, the pleasure we feel in the beautiful is one that does not involve passive contemplation, but rather an activity of making. In defending this view, he lays emphasis on Kant's claim that the pleasure we feel in the beautiful involves the exercise of a "freedom to make for ourselves an object of pleasure out of something," and he argues that this is a freedom that is expressed through the 'creative' and 'poetic' use of the productive imagination (13, quoting KU 5:210).[1] On this model, Chaouli claims that even something like Duchamp's Fountain can be found to be beautiful insofar as it is something our productive imaginations can make into an object of pleasure by relating to it creatively and poetically (13).

Although this way of describing Kant's view might make it seem as if it is the imagination alone that is responsible for aesthetic pleasure, as Chaouli makes clear in his analysis of universality and necessity in Chapter 2, for Kant, this pleasure is ultimately grounded in the free play of the imagination and understanding. By Chaouli's lights, however, on Kant's view, the demand for universality and necessity that arises from free play is one that involves "force without enforcement" in the sense that we cannot "compel assent" in aesthetic matters by resorting to concepts or rules (64, 28). We must, instead, rely on a felt attunement of our cognitive capacities and an attunement to humanity.

However, in Chapter 3, Chaouli argues that when we turn from the Analytic to Kant's account of the relationship between beauty and morality, we will find that Kant's theory of aesthetic experience is more complicated than it initially seems. Much of his argument turns on a reading of Kant's analysis of the intellectual interest in beauty in §42. Chaouli concentrates, in particular, on Kant's description of a person who, having turned away from society and toward nature, experiences "ecstasy [Wollust] . . . in a line of thought that he can never fully develop" (83, quoting KU 5:300). As Chaouli reads this example, Kant here 'belatedly' introduces a new core element of aesthetic experience, viz., open-ended interpretation in which we explore a line of thought that we can never fully develop (105). Moreover, Chaouli suggests that the fact that Kant uses the highly charged language of 'ecstasy' to describe this experience reveals that it is not the pure disinterested judgment of taste, but rather more complicated experiences, e.g., those involving interest or (later) art, that serve as Kant's "richest model of aesthetic experience" and exemplify "beauty at its fiercest" (82, 94).

Turning, then, in Part II to an analysis of Kant's theory of fine art and genius, Chaouli both aims to clarify Kant's account of artistic production and to show how this bears on his theory of aesthetic experience. According to Chaouli in Chapter 4, in his analysis of artistic production, Kant defends a theory of creativity according to which it involves "mak[ing] a new kind of sense" (116). In Chapter 6, Chaouli aligns this new kind of sense with what Kant calls 'aesthetic ideas', where these are imaginative ideas that are animated by spirit, outstrip concepts, and are expressed in the material configuration of a work of art.

Furthermore Chaouli suggests that for Kant the making of aesthetic ideas rests on a distinctive kind of freedom, a freedom Chaouli glosses negatively in terms of the "freedom from being determined by an external standard," e.g., external rules or remuneration, and positively in terms of the freedom to play or to "establish its own standards" (131, 134). In Chapter 5, Chaouli explores the challenges of attempting to unpack the freedom of genius, especially in light of Kant's typically negative characterization of it as something that "cannot be produced by following any rules" and that is "unsought and unintentional" (KU 5:317-18). To this end, Chaouli draws a parallel between Kant's account of genius and the psychoanalytic analysis of the unconscious, and suggests that we could think of genius as something that involves 'unthinking', i.e., as something that though it is a form of thinking nevertheless differs from concept-guided thinking (167).

Although Chaouli takes this analysis to elucidate the making at issue in artistic production, he thinks it at the same time clarifies Kant's theory of aesthetic experience. Indeed, he suggests it is only once we get to the account of art, genius, and aesthetic ideas that we are in a position to see that, for Kant, the aesthetic experience of beauty, whether in nature or art, is like artistic production insofar as it involves a form of making that rests on the freedom of play, i.e., a freedom that is free from external standards, that sets its own standards, and that remains somewhat opaque to us.

Finally, I want to raise some more critical concerns, first, for Chaouli's analysis of aesthetic experience, and, second, for his account of artistic production.

Though I am, in general, sympathetic to the idea that, for Kant, aesthetic experience is something that involves not just passive contemplation, but activity and even creativity, the first set of questions I have pertain to how we are to understand the nature of this activity and creativity. To begin, it is not clear to me how Chaouli conceives of the relationship between Kant's early account of free play in the Analytic and the account of interpretation Chaouli later locates in §42. The fact that he suggests Kant 'belatedly' introduces interpretation in §42 suggests that it is not already part of Kant's account of free play in the Analytic. However, it is not clear to me that this is the case. To be sure, how to read Kant's analysis of free play is a vexed issue, but if one endorses some version of the 'multi-cognitive' interpretation, then analyzing free play along the lines of open-ended interpretation might seem quite apt.[2] For, on this reading, in free play, the imagination organizes what we perceive in such a way that encourages the understanding to bring a whole host of concepts to bear on it in an open-ended way. This certainly seems to echo what Chaouli has in mind by open-ended interpretation. Granted, insofar as free play is a key component of pure judgments of taste, a more interpretation-friendly reading of free play would require a thicker reading of Kant's account of aesthetic experience in the Analytic than Chaouli sometimes indicates is warranted. Yet given Chaouli's own rather robust reading of the Analytic in Chapters 1 and 2, it seems an interpretive rendering of free play might fit well with his view.

The second question I have concerning Chaouli's analysis of aesthetic experience is how exactly he thinks the making at issue in aesthetic experience relates to the making at issue in artistic production for Kant. As we saw above, on Chaouli's reading, aesthetic experience rests on the "freedom to make for ourselves an object of pleasure out of something" (KU 5:210). Does this involve making the object into something like a work of art? Or is there another form of making involved in aesthetic experience that differs from the production of a work of art? Chaouli's initial description of the making at issue in aesthetic experience in Chapter 1 as something that involves 'poetry' [Dichtung] seems to push towards the former case. On this sort of reading, in free play the productive imagination poetically makes an object into something like a work of art that expresses aesthetic ideas. And this would, indeed, seem to align with Kant's later claim that, "Beauty (whether it be beauty of nature or of art) can in general be called the expression of aesthetic ideas" (KU 5:320). Chaouli, however, sets this claim aside as something that is "undercut by Kant's text" and confines aesthetic ideas to Kant's account of art (182).

So does Chaouli then think that the aesthetic experience of beauty in nature and art involves a making other than the kind involved in making a work of art? His claim that aesthetic experience is "a different and more oblique form of creativity" seems to point in this direction (74). But if not the making of a work of art, what kind of creative making of an object does aesthetic experience involve? Is the idea that there is a distinctive kind of making at issue in interpretation, a making in which you are responding to an object that is already there and treating it as a further object of interpretation? In the end, I was not entirely sure how to think about the making of aesthetic experience on Chaouli's view.

The final question I want to raise concerns Chaouli's interpretation of Kant's account of the freedom and intentionality of genius as something that swings free from concepts. On Chaouli's reading, the freedom involved in genius is not the freedom Kant describes in §43 as the "capacity for choice," i.e., the capacity for acting in accordance with concepts as 'ends' that we set through reason (KU 5:303, see 123). Instead, he claims that, for Kant, genius rests on the more opaque freedom of play and that the only guiding intention is the intention to "bring forth this artwork," an intention that is free from 'controlling' concepts (147, see also 151).

I am not sure, however, that we can or should distance Kant's account of genius from the form of freedom that involves concept-guided choice. If we look at Kant's summary of genius in §49, for example, we find him stating that, "as a talent for art, [genius] presupposes a determinate concept of the product as an end" and that an aesthetic idea is a "presentation of this concept" (KU 5:317, my emphasis). To be sure, Kant does not here claim that genius is, therefore, guided by external rules; however, he does indicate that the artist is guided by some concept of what she intends to explore in her work of art and that an aesthetic idea is an imaginative way of presenting that concept. Moreover earlier in §49 Kant indicates that the concept that is expressed through an aesthetic idea is not the concept 'this artwork', but rather, as Chaouli seems to acknowledge in Chapter 6, intellectual concepts, e.g., the rational concept 'eternity' or the empirical concept 'love' (KU 5:314-15). As I read Kant's view, then, the freedom of genius is something that involves the choice of some concept of reason or the understanding as the end, which the artist then attempts to imaginatively present through an aesthetic idea. To my mind, this reading not only has the advantage of seamlessly connecting Kant's analysis of art in §43 to his later account of genius, but also of pointing toward a way in which this account of genius bears on his broader concern in the third Critique of explaining how the gap between freedom and nature can be overcome. For these reasons, I am not sure we should separate the freedom of genius from the freedom of concept-guided choice.

There is much more to say about Chaouli's defense of the third Critique. However, by my lights, this is one of the virtues of his book: it opens up countless avenues for inquiry and gives us reasons to return to the third Critique attentive, once again, to what is remarkable in it.


Guyer, Paul. "The Harmony of the Faculties Revisited" in Values of Beauty: Historical Essays in Aesthetics. Cambridge University Press (2005): 77-109.

Kant, Immanuel. Critique of the Power of Judgment. Transl. Paul Guyer and Erich Matthews. Cambridge University Press (2002). [KU]

[1] Citations to the third Critique [KU] are to the volume and page of the Akademie edition.

[2] See Guyer (2005) for a discussion of the multi-cognitive interpretation of free play, as well as the competing pre-cognitive and meta-cognitive interpretations of it.