Thinking with Whitehead: A Free and Wild Creation of Concepts

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Isabelle Stengers, Thinking with Whitehead: A Free and Wild Creation of Concepts, Michael Chase (tr.), Harvard University Press, 2011, 531pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674048034.

Reviewed by Roland Faber, Claremont School of Theology


Isabelle Stengers' work on Whitehead was a long time in the making -- as a work on Whitehead's work, as an outcome of her thinking with Whitehead through different instantiations of her own writing, and as a process of translation from the French original. It is an important work, unusual not only for the bold generality with which it tries to characterize Whitehead's philosophical work in its most important manifestations, but even more importantly, for its effort to present a radical alternative mode of contemporary thinking. One is almost tempted to say that the urgency of this book's intensity is motivated by nothing less than Stengers' immediate feeling of the importance of Whitehead's work for the future of (human) civilization. Since we need to make life-and-death decisions regarding the directions we might (want to) take, the explication of Whitehead's alternatives may be vital. Hence to think with Whitehead is to think alternatives in which we "sign on in advance to an adventure that will leave none of the terms we normally use as they were." Yet, as a rule, Stengers is "with" Whitehead not only in sorting out such alternatives, but also in his non-confrontational method of peace-making, in which nothing "will be undermined or summarily denounced as a carrier of illusion." (24)

The two parts of the book roughly bring to light the development of Whitehead's thought and its shifting points of gravity, circling around two of its major developments.  One of these developments could be said to be temporal, since Whitehead's philosophical work over time can be characterized as developing from a philosophy of nature (as it was still embedded in the discussion of a philosophy of science) to a metaphysics (that included everything that a philosophy of science has excluded). The other is more spatial, since it circles around the excluded middle between the philosophy of science (excluding mind) and a general metaphysics (of all worlds), namely, a cosmology of our real universe. In an interesting twist, not so common today in any of the standard fields of discourse, we could also agree with Bruno Latour, who in his introduction suggests that both developments, the temporal -- how to overcome the bifurcation of nature -- and the spatial -- how to understand a cosmos of creative organisms -- are again (and further) de-centered by the unusual Whiteheadian reintroduction of "God." (xiii)

The first fourteen chapters that discuss the "temporal" development of Whitehead's thought ("From the Philosophy of Nature to Metaphysics") begin with a hermeneutical invitation to the reader to view the Whiteheadian adventure of thought as a dislocation from all commonly held beliefs and theories about nature and the world in general because it asks "questions that will separate them from every consensus." (7) As its major problem and point of departure, Stengers identifies Whitehead's criticism of the "bifurcation of nature," that is, the constitutional division of the universe into mutually exclusive sections (which are often at war with one another because of this division). One section consists of what science finds to be real, but valueless, and the other of that which constitutes mind -- a setup that reduces the first section to senseless motion and the second to mere "psychic additions." (xii) At first exploring Whitehead's The Concept of Nature, the beginning chapters draw out the contours of Whitehead's reformulation of the concept of nature, implying that it must not avoid "what the concept of nature designates as ultimate: knowledge." (41) In Whitehead's view, knowledge and conceptualization become essential to the concept of nature. While the "goal is not to define a nature that is 'knowable' in the philosophers' sense," Whitehead defines nature and knowledge "correlatively" such that "'what' we perceive does indeed designate nature rather than the perceiving mind." (44) Conversely, "exactness" is no longer an ideal, but "a thickness with a plurality of experiences occurring simultaneously -- like a person walking by." (55) With Bergson, Whitehead holds that such duration -- an event -- is the "foothold of the mind" (67) in nature. Being a standpoint, a perspective, paying attention to the aspects of its own integration, such a characterization of an event is meant to generate Whitehead's argument, as unfolded in Science and the Modern World, against the "fallacy of misplaced concreteness" (which excludes standpoints by introducing exactness in describing vacuous matter) and, thereby, the bifurcation of nature. (113)

On the way to the cosmology of Process and Reality -- itself "a labyrinth-book, a book about which one no longer knows whether it has an author, or whether it is not rather the book that has fashioned its author" (122) -- Stengers examines the two unexpected metaphysical chapters of Science and the Modern World -- on Abstraction and God -- as urged by the aesthetic question within a universe, which defines itself by some kind of harmony and a rationality, that is, by faith in the order of a nature, that does not exclude organisms as exhibiting "living values." (130) As it resists bifurcation, it enables us to reconcile science and philosophy. This is the moment where, as Stengers shows, Whitehead finds himself in a place where he needs to introduce the concept of God. This move is, however, not motivated by a "preliminary affirmation of His existence," but by a

fundamental experience of humanity . . . of which no religion can be the privileged expression, although each one develops and collapses, from epoch to epoch, according to whether its doctrines, its rites, its commands, or its definitions do or do not evoke this vision, revive it, or inhibit it, giving it or failing to give it adequate expression (133).

The second part ("Cosmology") features mainly Process and Reality. Stengers probes the uniqueness and necessity of speculative philosophy and its "intellectual intuition" (234) by exploring its criterion of reciprocal presupposition. (237) This expresses the impossibility of any bifurcation: "the ambition of speculative coherence is to escape the norms to which experiences, isolated by the logical, moral, empiricist, religious, and other stakes that privilege them, are" at "risk of ignoring” the mutuality of “each dancer's center of gravity" with the "dancer's spin." This mutuality of movement requires speculative philosophy, which, in its very production, brings to existence the possibility of a thought 'without gravity,' without a privileged direction. The 'neutral' metaphysical thought of Science and the Modern World had already risked the adventure of trusting others 'precursively' at the moment when one accepts that one’s "own body is put off balance." (239)

What, in such a world, is ultimately given, then? While in The Concept of Nature the Ultimate was Mind and in Science and the Modern World it was God, in Process and Reality it becomes Creativity. (255) Creativity affirms a universe of accidents, for which God introduces a requirement of the reciprocity of these accidents (265). Creativity is, like Deleuze's "plane of immanence", that "which insists and demands to be thought by the philosopher, but of which the philosopher is not in any way the creator." (268)

Stengers' distinctive mode of thought tries to avoid common dichotomies and to always highlight Whitehead's alternative, carved out of the always present aura of complexities that surrounds any activity of becoming, interpretation and reflection. Therefore, she introduces the meaning and function of the Whiteheadian organization of organisms -- each event being a "social effort, employing the whole universe" (275) -- and the organization of thought (the obligations of speculative philosophy) -- correcting the initial surplus of chaotic subjectivity (277). Both these forms of organization lead to "the most risky interpretation" (277) of empiricism as that which makes things hold together, neither crushed nor torn apart. Further investigating how occasions and philosophies function together (by dealing with what has been excluded), Stengers presents us with the fundamental importance of how "feeling" (or the transformation of scars) can offer new ways for (concepts of) life that testify to that which has been eliminated or neglected: how decisions can reduce the cost and victims they require (334) and, in actual and conceptual becoming, transform the status quo. (335) Whiteheadian feeling, of course, precedes consciousness and (even prior to perception) is the unconstrained reception that creates the events of its passing.

In chapters 21 and 22, God again enters the picture, not as rule of generality (metaphysically, aesthetically, or ethically), but as "divine endowment [that] thus corresponds to an individual possibility, not to what individuals should accomplish in the name of interest that transcend them." (390) Divine intervention responds to "what is best for this impasse" (421), a proposition whose actualization is indeterminate by definition. Here, Whitehead's metaphysics has rejected the normal/normative in favor of the relevant/valuable. (422) This again is related to the concepts of expression and importance in chapter 23, as "the way living societies can simultaneously canalize and be infected by what lurks [from the future]: originality." (429)

Most interestingly, Stengers describes this interstitial space as a "sacrament" -- the "unique sacrament of expression" -- that in its "call for a sacramental plurality" conveys Whitehead's understanding of "the cosmic meaning he confers upon expression and importance" in order to develop "a sociology of life" (435) for which signs are not only functional, but expressive. It is in this context that "Whitehead's metaphysical God does not recognize his own, he does not read our hearts, he does not understand us better than we do ourselves, he does not demand our recognition or our gratitude, and we shall never contemplate him in his truth." Rather, God "celebrates my relation to my self and my belongings, to my body, to my feelings, my intentions, my possibilities and perception." (448)

If there is, for Stengers, a divine function of salvation regarding Whitehead's God, it is that which only opens through following Whitehead's call for a secularization of the notion of the divine. (469, 477) Nothing (not a soul) is lost (in this new secularism), although it is only saved in "the unimaginable divine experience." (469) This "does not make God the being to whom one may say 'Thou,' for he has no other value than the difference he will make in the occasional experience that will derive from him its initial aim." (477) For Stengers, Whitehead wanted to save God from the role assigned to God by the theological propositions that make God the mere respondent to the religious vision. (479) Instead, God affirms the "full solemnity of the world" (493) for us through a neutral metaphysics in which God stands for all appetite, but impersonally so -- saving what is affirmed and excluded alike. (490)

Stengers concludes with one of the most astonishing characteristics of Whitehead's philosophy: namely, his missing ethics. Instead of viewing this as a lack, she conceives his philosophy as ethos, ethos as habit, and habit as aesthetics, (515) "celebrating the adventure of impermanent syntheses." This ethos, for Stengers, is not "critical wakefulness," but "the difference between dream and nightmare" -- a dream, a storytelling from within the Platonic cave, together with those who live and argue within in it, but also enjoy together the living values that can be received at the interstices. (516-7) In the end, as in the beginning, the adventure of alternative thinking in Whitehead asks us to walk with him in his vectors of disarming politeness -- by asking polite questions that one creature may address to another creature. (518)

If there is a weakness in Stengers' rendering of Whitehead's work, it is of a more generic nature, demonstrating its embeddedness in a wider cultural spirit or zeitgeist. Anyone who has some knowledge of the history and development of the reception of, and scholarship on, Whitehead will not fail to discover that Stengers is not the only one who has rediscovered this Whitehead, the Whitehead of the alternative adventure, at least within the last twenty years. Her sporadic recourse to Deleuze functions only as a fleeting spark of light that, if slowed down, would highlight the philosophic background on which current thinkers (including Stengers) have begun to view Whitehead. Although this remains almost undetected between the tectonic shifts of Stengers´ reconfiguration of Whitehead's thought, one will find Stengers' work to be the outcome of this same tradition. As with several other of these newer approaches, one of the (unfortunate) fault-lines of Stengers’ endeavor is that, when its sources remain hidden, it contradicts the Whiteheadian spirit of recollection, rediscovery and synthesis in ever new concrescences. Originality (creativity) must not suppress the traditions on which it stands; in particular, a hundred years of Whiteheadian scholarship in process theology that is left in silence. It is sad that a rediscovery of Whitehead should narrow the creative synthesis down by being dominated by such a negative prehension. Granted that from afar one might not see the inner diversity and rich potential of process theology's rhizomatic development, but to think that to name "God" (anew) in (Whitehead's) philosophy today is original when it in fact rehearses positions process theology has developed over the last century still leaves me with a question: Is freedom from the past necessarily coupled with its oblivion?

In any case, Stengers' Thinking with Whitehead is an important contribution to the current landscape of the rediscovery of Whitehead in philosophy and adjunct disciplines. It is also a gift for addressing urgent questions of survival and the "good and better life," the envisioning of which Whitehead sees as a function of philosophy. May Stengers' rendering of such an alternative congregation of thought for a new future of civilization steer us toward a more peaceful, polite, and less viciously violent vision.