This is Ethical Theory

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Jan Narveson, This is Ethical Theory, Open Court, 2010, 277pp., $36.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780812696462.

Reviewed by Craig Duncan, Ithaca College



The division between normative ethics and metaethics is an important and well-known division within ethical theory. Given this fact, it is striking how few undergraduate textbooks give serious and sustained attention to metaethics. Instead, it is much more common to find that the bulk of an ethics text discusses various normative theories (utilitarianism, Kantianism, etc.), with only a much shorter section, if any, devoted to the metaethical issues of moral truth, objectivity, and knowledge. Refreshingly, then, Jan Narveson’s textbook This is Ethical Theory breaks the common pattern by splitting its content roughly half and half between metaethics and normative ethics. Moreover, within the half devoted to normative ethics, Narveson is not content simply to survey various leading normative theories. He does include such a survey, but also adds a sustained defense of the social contract approach to morality in the mold of Thomas Hobbes and David Gauthier. This format makes the text, as Narveson himself claims on the first page, “not quite your ordinary introduction to ethical theory” (1). He goes on to say that he hopes the text will be read both by newcomers to philosophy and (on account of its “many novel claims and arguments”) also by professional philosophers (ibid.).

This is an ambitious plan of action for a single text. I wish I could say Narveson succeeds in his plan, but I cannot. As an introductory survey, This is Ethical Theory fails to introduce the reader to the most significant developments from the last couple of decades of ethical theorizing. Moreover, as a defense of a substantive normative theory, it leaves a number of important potential objections unexplored. That said, the book is not without its partial successes. Narveson’s informal, almost conversational, writing style does have its appeal, and may draw in some readers who would be put off by a more formal prose style. His criticisms of various metaethical theories (e.g., non-naturalism) are often interesting and strong. Finally, his metaethical analysis of the concept of a moral rule is clear and informative at the abstract level. Still, in my judgment, these successes do not overcome the book’s larger shortcomings.

This is Ethical Theory is divided into four parts. Part 1 (“Metaethics”) surveys a number of metaethical theories over 118 pages. Part 2 (“Normative Morals: A Review of Popular Theories”) surveys a variety of normative ethical theories over 58 pages. Part 3 (“Normative Morality: A Theory”) spends 49 pages defending Narveson’s version of social contract theory. Finally, Part 4 (“Happiness, Living Well, and Doing Well”) spends 24 pages exploring the question of what a good life is. I will say little about Parts 2 and 4 in this review, except to say here that in my judgment these sections try to do too much in too little space. Kantianism, for instance, is explained in a scant five pages; natural law theory is covered in one page.

I have more to say about Parts 1 and 3. One strong theme of Part 1 — and indeed, of the book as a whole — is the author’s distinction between “ethics” and “morality,” a distinction he insists is vital to clear thinking. Ethics, Narveson tells us, "is about how to live … A credible, though discussable answer, is that we should do whatever will give us the best life, or more generally, the good life" (31; emphasis in original). By contrast, "morality has, specifically, to do with how we are to treat, or deal with, or act in relation to, each other" (ibid.).

A key driver of Narveson’s conclusions regarding both the good (ethics) and the right (morality) is his methodological rejection of intuitionism. He makes some standard epistemological objections to intuitionism, asking by what mysterious mental faculty we allegedly come to recognize these truths. However, Narveson’s main complaint with intuitionism lies in intuitions’ alleged immunity to criticism: certain value or moral claims are simply announced as true by those who intuit them, and no further argument is or can be given; you either “see” the claims as true or you do not. According to Narveson, this feature makes an appeal to intuition a fundamentally non-rational exercise utterly at odds with the philosophical aim of supplying rational foundations for morality.

What does Narveson offer us instead of intuitions? Regarding goodness, he appeals to an analysis from a 1970 article by Francis Sparshott, according to which “To say that x is good is to say that x is such as to satisfy the wants of the person or persons concerned.”1 This analysis does not count as an appeal to intuition presumably because it avoids the browbeating that Narveson sees as inherent in intuition: this analysis will only tell person P that x is good if P already wants x. But if P already wants x, he in some sense already views it as good, and hence, does not need to be browbeaten into accepting this view.

At least two points of commentary are in order here. First, this analysis is most plausible as an analysis of “the good for person P” rather than an analysis of “goodness” sans phrase. These are separate concepts. Second, even as an analysis of “good for person P,” one would do well to wonder whether Sparshott’s analysis is adequate. What if P is ill-informed, or fails to imagine vividly the consequences of satisfying his wants, or suffers from some failure of instrumental rationality (his wants are contradictory, say)? It is worries like these, for instance, that led Peter Railton, in his classic 1986 paper on moral realism, to identify a person P’s good with what P would want for himself were he fully informed, vividly aware, and instrumentally ideally rational.2

Given the importance of the analysis of goodness to Narveson’s subsequent theorizing, it seems to me an oversight when he fails to explore “full information analyses” of a person’s good and the substantial literature this idea has inspired. In addition, this defect is more general, for just as he omits any mention of Railton’s influential metaethical views, Narveson also omits any mention of “the Cornell realists” or the recent prominent defenses of moral realism by Michael Smith and Russ Shafer-Landau. Additionally, in his discussion of non-cognitivism, he omits any mention of such prominent figures as Simon Blackburn and Allen Gibbard, and he nowhere acknowledges Richard Joyce’s recent defense of error theory. Indeed, there are compartively few references at all to works from the last twenty years (one exception to this is a discussion of Jonathan Dancy’s recent work on moral particularism).

Of course, no textbook can cover every thinker on a subject; indeed, it can make sense for a textbook writer to focus primarily on seminal ideas rather than clutter up the text with detailed references to this or that thinker. However, Narveson does not take this approach. His text is full of detailed analyses both of the ideas of influential thinkers like Charles Stevenson and Richard Hare, as well as of lesser known (but still interesting) figures like Francis Sparshott, Brand Blandshard, and Kai Neilsen. Significant space is also devoted to considering some early ideas of John Searle and Alan Gewirth. Given that Narveson is not averse to focusing on the ideas of individual thinkers, it is curious that he omits so many more recent thinkers. When reading the book, I had the sense that the bulk of it was in fact likely written long ago. In short, to learn of important metaethical developments from the last twenty to twenty-five years, a reader will have to look elsewhere.

Let me now finish my look at Part 1 by turning to consider Narveson’s analysis of moral rightness. Here he is on firmer grounds than his analysis of goodness. According to Narveson, moral rightness is defined by moral rules. Moral rules in turn are identified as rules with the following features: they are not legislated, they are intended to be complied with by everybody and informally enforced by everybody, and they are reasonable and impartial (197-98).

At an abstract level, this is a plausible analysis of moral rules; the difficulties appear not with Part 1’s metaethical analysis of the concept of a moral rule, but rather with Part 3’s attempt to derive a normative libertarian social and political morality from this metaethical analysis. A key part of this derivation is Narveson’s interpretation of impartiality. Plausibly, he takes impartiality to mean that the rules in question are concerned with everyone’s good. Less plausibly, he plugs into this formula his previous analysis of goodness, so that a rule counts as a genuine moral rule only if it can be shown to advance some or other want of each and every person. Following Hobbes, Narveson notes that everyone wants to avoid violent death at others’ hands, so a rule prohibiting murder is for everyone’s good in the sense just identified; hence, a rule against murder counts as a genuine moral rule. Presumably, too, we all want to avoid being the victim of theft and fraud, so morality condemns these acts as well.

Beyond this libertarian core morality, however, Narveson is skeptical that human wants are uniform enough to allow us to say that any non-libertarian moral norm will work to everyone’s advantage. In particular, a positive moral duty on the part of the wealthy to help the poor would require the wealthy to do what many of them would not want to do, namely, part with some portion of their wealth. For those individuals who do not want to part with a portion of their wealth for this reason, Narveson’s analysis of goodness says that assisting the poor is not part of their good. Hence a moral rule requiring assistance to the poor is not for everyone’s good; instead, it is for the good of the poor at the expense of the good of the (recalcitrant) rich. As such, a rule of this sort fails to qualify as impartial in Narveson’s favored sense, and hence, it fails to be a genuine moral rule (though Narveson is willing to allow, within ethics as opposed to morality, that charity is a virtue).

Numerous possible criticisms of this moral view spring to mind. One might for instance object that no one is guaranteed never to suffer from poverty (stock markets may crash, businesses may fail, legal troubles may arise, illnesses may happen, accidents may occur, wars may break out, etc.), and hence a rule of aid to those in need is indeed potentially for everyone’s good. Narveson’s reply to this is that for many well-off people, such fears are remote enough that the expected costs of a rule establishing a positive duty of assistance far outweigh its expected benefits, so that the rule fails to count as “reasonable” — another defining feature of a moral rule mentioned above (227). (Alternative understandings of reasonableness, such as that of T. M. Scanlon, are not mentioned, let alone considered in any detail.)

Other objections are possible. For example, perhaps a decent moral and political social safety net (a moral duty to aid others plus politically-supported health insurance, unemployment insurance, etc.), as well as reasonable policies aimed at ensuring adequate opportunity for all (such as a public education system) in fact are to everyone’s advantage, even in Narveson’s extremely narrow sense. After all, even capitalists want a skilled and healthy work force, as well as the absence of riots owing to malcontent and deep-seated social grievances. It is an empirical question whether libertarianism (untried, and pie-in-the-sky according to many) would do a better job of providing these benefits than, say, a European-style social democracy or even an American-style minimal welfare state. Narveson too often falls prey to the false dichotomy of assuming a choice between either libertarianism or a radical same-income-for-all style of egalitarianism, when in fact there is a range of middle alternatives between either extreme. As such, Narveson’s case for libertarian property rights is woefully underdetermined.

One more general criticism of Narveson’s normative theory concerns the gap between, on the one hand, the motive that Narveson identifies for being moral (namely, the rational pursuit of one’s own good) and, on the other hand, the content of morality (which as we have seen, is said to encompass everyone’s good). Suppose, for instance, that I find myself with an opportunity to advance my good by breaking a moral rule — say, I find a wallet loaded with money on the seat of a near empty bus; its owner is identifiable from its contents but I could easily pocket the wallet with effectively no chance of being noticed. Why should I follow the moral rule of respecting others’ property when in this instance it disadvantages me to do so?

This question has bedeviled social contract theorists from Hobbes down through Gauthier, and Narveson fares no better. After offering the standard line that you ought not to be so sure you won’t get caught, he appeals to a notion that a kind of “disharmony of soul” results from my behaving in ways that I admit are designated as to-be-sanctioned by social institutions that I myself have reason to want to exist (224). But what if I have a stronger want for the money in the wallet than for this somewhat ethereal harmony of the soul? As far as I can see Narveson’s account of goodness would force him to conclude that it is better for me in this instance to break than to follow the rule.

Moreover, the “Why be moral?” worry takes on an even more sinister form when it is formulated in group-based terms rather than in individualistic terms. In individualistic terms, the question is more tractable. As an individual, after all, it is rational of me to seek agreement on social rules with all other individuals, because (as Hobbes long ago noted) any one of us is powerful enough to pose a threat to any one other. Power between individuals is not strictly equal, of course — but it is equal enough to give each individual significant incentive to forge an agreement with other individuals. (My continued compliance, however, with this agreement on every occasion remains an issue, for the reasons cited in the preceding paragraph.) By contrast with individuals, however, groups are often not even roughly equal in power. Hence individuals from within a powerful majority can agree amongst themselves to treat each other decently while at the same time excluding a despised and relatively powerless minority from some or all of the protections of this social agreement.

It is true that Narveson perhaps needn’t conclude that such behavior is moral. Morality, he can insist, is for everyone’s good, and the good of the individuals comprising the minority are being ignored in this example. The challenge, though, is to explain why the members of the majority should care about this fact, if (as Narveson insists) morality is only instrumentally valuable as a device for enhancing the pursuit of one’s own advantage (267). If the majority benefits from the oppression (say that owing to rampant discrimination, the oppressed minority does all the menial jobs in society for rock-bottom pay) then it looks like in this case moral treatment of the minority is not to the advantage of members of the majority. Why then should they care whether they treat the minority morally?

Perhaps it will be argued that the potential for riots or terrorist bombings ought to sway the majority. But are these possible harms likely enough to outweigh the likely benefits of oppression? And might not even more ruthless oppression make these possible harms even less likely? At the very least, the relevance of these empirical considerations needs to be acknowledged. And what if the oppressed group does not live even within the majority’s borders but instead, say, is a technologically primitive group whose faraway lands have been colonized by the powerful group to which I belong? Is it so clear that this sort of colonial exploitation by my group is a bad bet for me, given that its dangers are (quite literally) so distant? In essence, this is a group-based version of a well-known objection to Hobbesian-style social contract theories — namely, that they offer no guaranteed protection to powerless beings who pose no real threat to others; harmless animals, infants and young children, and the severely handicapped are frequently mentioned as examples of these.3 This objection may be pithily expressed by insisting that a being (or group of beings) should not have to be able to threaten harm in order to have its (their) rights recognized. (As John Rawls observed, “To each according to his threat advantage” is not an adequate conception of justice.4) Narveson fails to give this well-known objection its due attention.

No doubt Narveson would dismiss this concern of mine for the powerless as just so much intuition-mongering on my part, and hence, as non-rational in the sense I mentioned above when describing his opposition to intuitionism. It would cut no ice with Narveson, moreover, were I to reply that in proposing this objection I am employing the well-known methodology of reflective equilibrium. For in a single paragraph, Narveson likewise dismisses reflective equilibrium as itself fatally committed to intuitionism (186). This dismissal, however, is too quick. No doubt reflective equilibrium relies in a very significant way on intuitions. However, the practitioner of reflective equilibrium does not present his or her intuitive starting points as entirely beyond criticism (which, as we earlier saw, is Narveson’s main complaint against intuitionism). Instead, the practitioner moves back and forth between these intuitive “considered convictions” and the higher-level theoretic claims that allegedly explain them. Rather than dogmatically clinging to any of his or her starting points, the practitioner is open in principle to making revisions at either level, the intuitive or the theoretical. In this sense, he or she does not place intuitions beyond criticism. Thus, reflective equilibrium is not quite “intuitionism” as Narveson understands it.

This is not to say that reflective equilibrium is free of difficulties. It leaves the metaphysical status of morality unexplained, for instance, and it offers no ex ante guarantee that practitioners would even in principle eventually converge on the same moral picture. Admittedly, then, it is hard to be wholly satisfied with the reflective equilibrium methodology. But for the reasons I have described above, I find it even harder to be satisfied with Narveson’s libertarian morality, despite its metaphysical parsimony.

1 Sparshott, F. E. “Disputed Evaluations,” American Philosophical Quarterly 7, no. 2 (1970): 131-42.

2 Railton, Peter. “Moral Realism,” The Philosophical Review 95, no. 2 (1986): 163-207.

3 See for instance Martha Nussbaum’s book-length exploration of these problems for social contract theory in her Frontiers of Justice: Disability, Nationality, Species Membership (Belknap Press, 2007). Nussbaum also believes these are problems for Rawls’s non-Hobbesian style of contractualism.

4 John Rawls, A Theory of Justice (Belknap Press, 1971), 134.