Thisness Presentism: An Essay on Time, Truth, and Ontology

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David Ingram, Thisness Presentism: An Essay on Time, Truth, and Ontology, Routledge, 2019, 216pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138322103.

Reviewed by Natalja Deng, Yonsei University


Are there objective differences between the past, present, and future? In particular, are present events and entities somehow more real than those wholly in the past or in the future? If you're inclined to answer 'Yes', you're inclined towards presentism, the view that 'necessarily, it is always the case that only present entities exist and what is present changes' (35). Presentism has seemed commonsensical to many. But it's not easy to be a presentist. If you're a presentist, you have your philosophical work cut out for you.

In this book, David Ingram presents a thoughtful, elegant, and beautifully argued defense of a particular version of presentism, one that has hitherto not been developed in detail (though Ingram acknowledges important precursors in. e.g., Adams (1986), Keller (2004), Plantinga (1974), and Diekemper (2015). Ingram's aim is to defend presentism by defending its best version.

Given this aim, one might expect a defense of presentism over other views, followed by a defense of thisness presentism over rival versions of presentism. That's not quite how Ingram proceeds. Ch. 2 does point to three reasons to be a presentist, including its alleged proximity to common sense. But these are offered as minimal, defeasible reasons to be a presentist, and as reasons to be interested in the project. They are not presented as a full-scale defense of presentism over rivals. The book is about how thisness presentism can help presentists solve various problems, and how on the whole, it does this better than presentist competitors. Thus, it seems natural to think of it as a conditional defense of thisness presentism: if you're a presentist, you should be a thisness presentist.

Before presenting thisness presentism, Ingram provides a helpful discussion of what he takes presentism, in general, to say. His definition (cited in the first paragraph above) succeeds in capturing the mainstream understanding. At the same time, it incorporates some substantial (and sensible) choices, such as to include in presentism a claim about dynamicity or temporal passage, namely that what is present changes. Here as elsewhere in the book, Ingram elegantly moves forward a voluminous and wide-ranging literature.

Ch. 1 also discusses the triviality argument -- roughly, the objection that presentism is either the trivially true view that only present entities exist now, or the clearly false view that only present entities have existed, exist now, or will exist. Ingram seems sympathetic to the response that it's the view that only present entities exist, simpliciter (though more attention is given to 'only present entities existed, exist now, or will exist'). But while this serves the aim of Ch. 1, namely to show that the triviality argument doesn't obviously succeed, the question of what's at stake arguably remains open (e.g., Deng 2018). Take, for example, Ingram's contention that Ulrich Meyer is wrong to think that if x did exist then x exists in the past (Meyer 2005, 214). As Ingram sees it, this doesn't follow. It's not the case that x exists in the past, even though x did exist. But is it so clear what's at issue here? Ask yourself whether it does or does not follow, from x's having existed, that x exists in the past. It would not be unreasonable for you to demand to know first what it means to deny that an x (that all parties agree existed, such as Marie Curie) exists in the past. And what you'd be puzzled about is what presentists and non-presentists are disagreeing about.

Particular versions of presentism exacerbate this problem. For example, Ingram takes Williamsonian presentism to be the view that entities like Marie Curie don't cease to exist (because everything always exists), they just cease to be concrete (196). Ingram points out that in order for this to be a presentist view, we have to think of Curie as existing non-concretely, in the present (though she used to be concrete). By contrast, the non-presentist interpretation of the view would be that she is non-concrete, in the past (since only present entities are concrete). However, even supposing one understands the difference between a concrete and a non-concrete Curie, is it so clear what to make of the further distinction between a non-concrete Curie in the past and a non-concrete Curie in the present?

Here is the core of thisness presentism (57):

(Nature) For any entity x, x instantiates a thisness, the property being (identical with) x, which is a particular, primitive, non-qualitative property of x. (Life) x's thisness, T, comes into being with x, T is uniquely instantiated by x throughout x's existence, and if x ceases to exist, then T continues to exist uninstantiated. (Character) x's thisness, T, instantiates higher-level properties, some of which indirectly characterise x; these higher-level properties of T initially correspond to the lower-level properties of x.

On thisness presentism, while there (presently) are all the thisnesses of wholly past entities, as well as those of present entities, there are no thisnesses of wholly future entities. Thus, this presentist view seems well positioned to reap some of the benefits of the growing block view (on which past and present exist but the future does not). And indeed, one suggested benefit is that the view allows one to hold that the future, unlike the past, is open or unsettled (Ch. 7). Further suggested benefits relate to problems concerning structured singular propositions about wholly past entities (Ch. 4), to truth-makers for truths about the past (Chs. 5 and 6), and to temporal passage (Ch. 8). The overall strategy is Lewisian: show that thisness presentism solves important metaphysical problems (for presentists), and thereby show that (for presentists) there is good reason to think it's true. The final chapters relate the book to Ingram's joint work with Jonathan Tallant on nefarious presentism, and complete the case for thisness presentism by comparing it to two more rivals (Williamsonian presentism and ersatzist presentism).

The book contains a wealth of interesting material. What follows is a summary of key moves, together with some reactions.

Suppose you think that 'Socrates was wise' expresses a singular propositions about Socrates (namely <Socrates was wise>), a proposition that is about Socrates in a direct, non-accidental way. If you're also a presentist, you can't account for this direct aboutness by taking Socrates to be a constituent of <Socrates was wise>. But, if you're open to becoming a thisness presentist, you have an alternative: you can take Socrates's thisness to partly constitute <Socrates was wise>. According to Ingram, this secures the direct aboutness and reference to Socrates. Moreover, singular propositions about present entities can be treated similarly. All singular propositions are constituted by thisnesses. For example, 'Theresa May was the Prime Minister' expresses a proposition (<Theresa May was the Prime Minister>) that is partly constituted by May's thisness, not May herself, even though she exists. Finally, propositions about thisnesses, such as <Socrates's thisness exists>, are partly constituted by thisnesses of thisnesses, in this case by Socrates's thisness's thisness (being Socrates's thisness). According to Ingram, it is thereby directly about Socrates's thisness.

However, this picture is later modified. <Socrates was wise> is in fact also about Scorates's thisness -- just less directly, or in a different sense. Here is a sufficient condition for aboutness (call it 'A'): p is about x if p is partly constituted by x or x's thisness (129).

This modification plays an important role when it comes to providing truth-makers for propositions about the past. Ingram insists that the truth-makers for such propositions need to be whatever those propositions are about. Prima facie, propositions about the past are about the past; hence the problem for presentists. But given A, the thisness presentist has an answer. On thisness presentism, the truth-maker for <Socrates existed> is the fact that Socrates's thisness instantiates the primitive past-tensed property having been the thisness of an existent. Since <Socrates existed> is about Socrates's thisness (just less directly, or in a different sense, than it is about Socrates), the aboutness constraint is satisfied.

Ingram anticipates the objection that there is no intuitive sense of 'aboutness' on which <Socrates existed> is about Socrates's thisness. His reply is that indeed there is not, but that given A, <Socrates existed> is also about Socrates's thisness.

But at this point one may perhaps reasonably wonder which independent constraints are guiding the discussion. Ingram says he is not providing a complete analysis of aboutness. Instead he is 'guided by the idea that there is an intuitive sense of 'aboutness' that can be captured or illustrated by examples, but which also resists (complete) analysis' (130). Given that our intuitive sense of 'aboutness' is intended to play this role, the objection seems to retain some force.

Here is a somewhat curious feature of thisness presentism. Marie Curie no longer instantiates being the woman who discovered Polonium, because she doesn't exist. She instantiated that property from 1898 (when she discovered Polonium) up until her death in 1934, but she doesn't now. Accordingly, her thisness no longer instantiates being the thisness of the woman who discovered Polonium. So suppose we tried to characterize Curie by listing properties she had during her lifetime, such as being a physicist, being a woman, having been a child once, being called 'Marie Curie', etc. Her thisness does not instantiate the higher-level properties corresponding to any of them. It doesn't instantiate being the thisness of a physicist, nor being the thisness of a woman, nor being the thisness of someone who was once a child, nor being the thisness of someone called 'Marie Curie'. So what makes her thisness into Curie's thisness? The intended answer, presumably, is that thisnesses are primitive, and thereby not reducible to any other properties. But it's still somewhat curious that when Curie dies, her thisness loses all of these properties without ceasing to be her thisness. When she dies, her thisness goes from being the thisness of a former child to merely having been the thisness of a child, and from being the thisness of a physicist to merely having been the thisness of a physicist. That sounds a little as if her thisness's thisness days are over, so to speak.

Similarly, consider Curie's thisness's metric-tensed properties. Right now, her thisness instantiates merely having been the thisness of the woman who discovered Polonium 121 years ago (since it's 2019, and she discovered it in 1898). It doesn't instantiate being the thisness of the woman who discovered Polonium 121 years ago. After all, since she doesn't exist, she doesn't instantiate being the woman who discovered Polonium 121 years ago. The idea is that <Curie discovered Polonium 121 years ago> is true nonetheless, and it's made true by her thisness's instantiating having been the thisness of the woman who discovered Polonium 121 years ago. But there is something odd about that property. When, in the past, can her thisness have been the thisness of the woman who discovered Polonium 121 years ago? After all, she's that woman only now, 121 years after the discovery.

In Ch. 8, Ingram responds to an interesting argument by Lisa Leininger (Leininger 2015), which, he points out, is a specific instance of Kit Fine's 'Argument from Passage' against A-theories (roughly, dynamic theories of time) (e.g. Fine 2006). In a footnote, he notes that Huw Price has raised a very similar objection (Price 2011). Ingram argues that thisness presentists can meet the challenge (in all its versions) better than other presentists can.

Leininger's version goes roughly as follows. Presentists say that what is present changes. But in order to be justified in saying this, i.e. in order to secure temporal change, they would need to be able to rule out that our world is a one-instant world (OIW), in which there have been no past events and will be no future events. And presentists are not able to do this. Various versions of presentism fail the one-instant test (OIT), which is whether God could create a OIW that contains all the ingredients posited by that version of presentism. Take, for example, John Bigelow's Lucretian presentism, on which e.g. <Socrates existed> is made true by the world's now instantiating having contained Socrates. Leininger contends that Lucretian presentism fails the OIT. The reason is that what's needed to pass the OIT is a causal relation between the past and the world's current past-tensed properties. But such a causal connection would be existence-entailing; it would require the past to exist. So it is inconsistent with presentism.

Ingram's reply is that while Leininger is right about Lucretian presentism, thisness presentism escapes the difficulty. He reasons that on thisness presentism, there is no causal connection between present thisnesses and their former bearers. Instead, as independently developed in an earlier chapter (Ch. 3), thisnesses (temporally) non-rigidly ontologically depend on their bearers. This means that e.g. Socrates's thisness is such that necessarily, it exists only if Socrates exists or has existed (and it is not the case that, necessarily, Socrates exists only if Socrates's thisness has existed).

Slightly re-formulated, his reply comes to this. There is no causation involved in the coming into existence of thisnesses with their bearers, only non-rigid ontological dependence. And, non-rigid ontological dependence is not existence-entailing across times. If we think of it as existence-entailing, we should think of it as holding only for one instant, namely the initial instant of an entity's existence. If we don't, we can think of it as holding at other times too. (Ingram seems to leave both options open (67).) In either case, it nonetheless is enough of a dependence relation, enough of a connection, to guarantee that thisnesses can't exist unless their bearers do or did. This is simply secured by the definition of non-rigid ontological existence.

Three brief comments on this. First, thisness presentism does sound like it involves causation (thisnesses are brought into existence, they are traces, etc.). Second though, there are other ways out of Leininger's argument, for example along the lines Ingram himself explores when discussing causation (which he recommends presentists should take not to be cross-temporal either (172)). For the same reason, it's not clear why rival versions of presentism (such as Lucretianism) should be at a disadvantage here. Third, there is an insight in the vicinity of the argument, which is that the way in which the presentist (and A-theorist more generally) is able to secure passage, falls short of what the A B opposition leads one to expect in the first place (Deng 2013). One is told that one side in this debate, the A-theoretic one, can capture the whoosh of experience. But this whoosh is temporally extended (tick-tock). It gives equal prominence to two present moments. That's what presentists can't capture. It's just that this teaches us more about the debate than about presentism.

The book is a superb piece of work. Anyone interested in the philosophy of time, whether presentist or non-presentist, metaphysician or non-metaphysician, stands to benefit greatly from engaging with it.


Thanks to David Ingram for feedback on a draft.


Adams, R. M. (1986), 'Time and thisness', Midwest Studies in Philosophy 11, pp. 315-329.

Deng, N. (2013), 'Fine's McTaggart, Temporal Passage, and the A versus B debate', Ratio 26/1, pp. 19-34.

Deng, N. (2018), 'What is temporal ontology?', Philosophical Studies 175/3, pp. 793-807.

Diekemper, J. (2015) 'The ontology of thisness', Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 90, pp. 49-71.

Fine, K. (2006), 'The Reality of Tense', Synthese 150 (3), pp. 399-414.

Keller, S. (2004), 'Presentism and truthmaking', in Oxford Studies in Metaphysics, Vol. 1, ed. D. Zimmerman, Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 83-104.

Leininger, L. (2015), 'Presentism and the myth of passage', Australasian Journal of Philosophy 93, pp. 724-739.

Meyer, U. (2005), 'The presentist's dilemma', Philosophical Studies 122, pp. 213-225.

Plantinga, A. (1974), The Nature of Necessity, Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Price, H. (2011), 'The Flow of Time', in ed. C. Callender The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Time, Oxford: Oxford University Press.