Thomas Aquinas on the Passions

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Robert Miner, Thomas Aquinas on the Passions, Cambridge UP, 2009, 315pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521897488.

Reviewed by Andrew Pinsent, University of Oxford



Robert Miner’s Thomas Aquinas on the Passions is a valuable introduction to that neglected part of the Summa theologiae, ST 1a2ae, qq.22-48, which examines the passions. This book is not organised in the form of an argument for a particular thesis or mode of interpretation, but aims to “facilitate an encounter with Thomas Aquinas’s teaching on the passions” (8). Nevertheless, two principal themes emerge. First, Aquinas considers the passions to be an integral aspect of human flourishing, not simply obstacles to be overcome. Second, his account of the passions is subtle and wide-ranging, from the sublime heights of spiritual ecstasy and the wounds of love, to the effects of toothache and the banishing of sorrow by a bath. Given the comparative neglect of this aspect of Aquinas’s anthropology, Miner’s efforts to communicate Aquinas’s thought to contemporary readers are timely and welcome.

After a brief justification for studying Aquinas on the passions, Miner introduces some general principles and then proceeds quickly to a study of ST 1a2ae, qq.22-48. Rather than cover every detail, he presents the main themes of Aquinas’s articles in the form of an admirably clear narrative. Part I examines the passions in general: the sensitive appetite, the passions as acts of the sensitive appetite, the things that activate the passions and Aquinas’s account of the relationship between passions and morality. Part II examines the particular concupiscible passions: love, hatred and concupiscence, pleasure and sorrow. Part III examines the particular irascible passions: hope and despair, fear, daring and anger. An epilogue examines briefly how the passions are related to the virtues and happiness.

Where this book excels is in clarifying language, making distinctions and correcting common misconceptions. For example, Miner shows that it is not unknown for commentators to interpret the irascible passions as the aggressive or ‘negative’ passions and the concupiscible passions as the affective or ‘positive’ passions (25). While this interpretation is plausible, especially given that the word ‘irascible’ is derived from ‘ira’ (anger), it is also incorrect. Miner points out that Aquinas classifies hope, an apparently ‘positive’ passion, as irascible while hatred, a ‘negative’ passion, is concupiscible (25). Arguing especially from ST 1a q.81, a.2 and 1a2ae q.23, Miner shows that the object of the irascible passions is the arduous or difficult good, in contrast to the concupiscible passions, which are attracted simply to what is good and repelled by what is evil. The two sets of passions are therefore complementary, since the irascible passions counteract the tendency of the concupiscible passions to be repelled by obstacles to their fulfilment (46-57). Clarifications of this kind make Miner’s book a valuable guide for following Aquinas’s text and avoiding common mistakes.

Nevertheless, any book that confines itself for the most part to just one section of the Summa theologiae risks missing the broader context within which that section is embedded. The most detailed aspect of this broader context is that of the virtues, organised under the three theological and four cardinal virtues of ST 2a2ae qq.1-170. True virtues for Aquinas, however, are infused rather than acquired, as is indicated by Aquinas’s non-Aristotelian definition of the genus of virtue, “”letter-spacing: -0.1pt;“>Virtue is a good quality of the mind, by which we live righteously, of which no one can make bad use, which God works in us, without us.”1 Furthermore, Aquinas does not even regard acquired virtues, that is, those obtained by our own repeated good actions, as being proper virtues at all, but only virtues in a restricted sense: “Only the infused virtues are perfect, and deserve to be called virtues simply.”2 Unlike acquired virtues, infused virtues are unified by caritas (divine friendship), they can be received by anyone, they can co-exist with contrary acquired dispositions, they can be gained immediately by divine infusion and they can be lost immediately by one seriously evil action.3 Consistent with Aquinas’s treatment of the genus of virtue as infused, there are several indications that his vast treatise on the particular virtues, ST 2a2ae qq.1-170, is a treatise on the infused virtues, not the acquired virtues.4

Virtues are not, however, the only kind of perfective habitus described in the Summa theologiae. Another set of habitus, the Gifts, is appended to the virtues. So, for example, following his treatise on courage as a virtue, ST 2a2ae qq.123-138, Aquinas appends a further question describing an entirely new habitus, the Gift of Courage.5 Although this Gift of Courage is also infused, Aquinas claims that a Gift is a different kind of habitus from an infused virtue.6 Similar associations between virtues and Gifts can be found throughout Aquinas’s treatise on the virtues.7 These Gifts are not optional: Aquinas claims that they are essential for his account of human flourishing, that they are more important than the moral and intellectual virtues and even that they are the origins or foundations (principia) of these virtues.8 Aquinas also tells us that the Gifts extend to the same kinds of things as those to which the virtues extend, but that their mode of operation is different. The Gifts enable us to be ‘moved’ by God, in a union of caritas with God, in respect of these same things.9 These Gifts thereby introduce an interpersonal or specifically second personal principle into Aquinas’s account of human perfection.10

Given that the virtues are associated with the passions, as Miner shows (287-299), and that the Gifts extend to the same things as the virtues extend, as Aquinas states, then any complete account of Aquinas on the passions needs to show how they are associated with both the infused virtues and the Gifts. Furthermore, any such account also needs to set out clearly whether the passions, as Aquinas describes them in ST 1a2ae, qq.22-48, are associated with the infused virtues and Gifts or with those virtues that are acquired in an Aristotelian manner. In considering which of these options are correct, it would be rather surprising if Aquinas were to spend so much effort to describe passions that are perfected only by Aristotelian virtue, given that he regards only the infused virtues as true virtues. In addition, there are some peculiar characteristics of the passions, points to which Miner himself draws attention, that imply an underlying principle that is interpersonal and consonant with the infused virtues and Gifts. For instance, Aquinas describes shame as a ‘wicked fear’, and hence an example of an evil passion (93 fn. 7; ST 1a2ae, q.24, a.4), whereas Aristotle places shamelessness among the evil passions (Nicomachean Ethics, 2.6, 1107a9-18). This difference might be explained by the fact that shame is compatible with an Aristotelian account of virtue, since no one action can cause the loss of acquired virtue, but is not compatible with infused virtue, since the passion of shame can only arise in the context of a betrayal of caritas. Similarly, Aquinas identifies contempt or slight (280; cf. ST 1a2ae, q.47, a.2) as the sole motive of the passion of anger. This singular motive may make sense in the light of the infused virtues and Gifts, since contempt is directed at persons and is, therefore, opposed to the interpersonal virtue of caritas by which these habitus are unified.

Miner, however, does not raise directly the question of the species of the virtues that perfect the passions of ST 1a2ae, qq.22-48, despite the importance of clarifying this issue. The relation of the Gifts to the virtues and passions is not addressed at all, even in the epilogue which is devoted to the broader context of the passions, virtues and happiness. What a few passages do imply is that Miner leans towards the association of the passions with the acquired virtues. He claims, for example, that the usual order of perfection is to acquire the habit of aiming for the arduous good in earthly matters first, implying the perfection of the acquired virtues, and only then to attempt to strive for divine things (228), presumably by means of the infused virtues. He also claims that the passion of hope is perfected by ‘acquired magnanimity’ (227).11 With regard to the first claim, the problem with suggesting that acquired virtues are a kind of prerequisite of the infused virtues (even apart from the fact that Aquinas would reject any semi-Pelagian approach) is that Aquinas underlines that acquired and infused virtues are of different species, as noted previously. Furthermore, in his scriptural commentaries, Aquinas sometimes interprets bodily sicknesses as symbolising disordered passions, implying that he regards these disorders as being healed through the relationship to God, not that self-healing is a prerequisite for this relationship.12 With regard to the second claim, it is not apparent that Aquinas is in fact referring to acquired magnanimity in ST 2a2ae qq.129-133, given that the virtues of ST 2a2ae qq.1-170 are generally infused, as noted previously. At the very least, the species of magnanimity in question needs to be justified rather than assumed.

In conclusion, Miner’s book is an excellent guide for reading Aquinas’s articles on the passions, especially insofar as the book clarifies terms and corrects misconceptions. What is lacking, however, is a satisfactory account of how these passions integrate into Aquinas’s overall conception of human flourishing, an account that addresses, in particular, the issue of the infused virtues and the Gifts.

1 ST 1a2ae q.55 a.4, c. This definition is taken from Lombard, Sent., 2.27.1 no. 1 and draws principally from Augustine, De Libero Arbitrio II, 19. As Jordan has pointed out, this definition of virtue is the only one that Aquinas sets out explicitly to defend. See Mark Jordan, “Theology and philosophy,” in The Cambridge Companion to Aquinas, ed. Norman Kretzmann and Eleonore Stump, 1993, 237-241.

2 ST 1a2ae q.65 a.2, c.

3 Regarding caritas as divine friendship, see ST 2a2ae, q.23, a.1; for the unification of the infused virtues by caritas, see ST 1a2ae, q.65, a.3; for the reception of the infused virtues by anyone, see ST 2a2ae, q.47, a.14; for the co-presence of an infused virtue and a contrary acquired vice, see ST 1a2ae, q.65, a.3; for the immediate gain or loss of the infused virtues, see ST 1a2ae q.71 a.4. For a brief overview of the non-Aristotelian characteristics of the infused virtues, see, for example, Jean Porter, “The Subversion of Virtue: Acquired and Infused Virtues in the ‘Summa Theologiae’,” Annual of the Society of Christian Ethics (1992): 19-41. Miner among others has also drawn attention to Aquinas’s non-Aristotelian approach to the virtues. See Robert C. Miner, “Non-Aristotelian Prudence in the Prima Secundae,” The Thomist 64, no. 3 (2000): 401-422.

4 There are, for example, places in his treatise where Aquinas contrasts explicitly the unqualified virtue he is describing with an acquired counterpart. In ST 2a2ae, q.47, a.14, for instance, he argues that the prudence he is describing is infused along with grace and caritas, in contrast to acquired prudence (prudentia acquisita). The association of the virtues of ST 2a2ae qq.47-170 with caritas and other non-Aristotelian habitus is also emphasised, for example, in ST 2a2ae, q.124, a.2 and q.141, a.1, ad 2, underlining that the virtues Aquinas is describing are not acquired in an Aristotelian manner. Aquinas also appends three additional attributes, Gifts, Beatitudes and Fruits, to the virtues in ST 2a2ae qq.47-170, underlining the non-Aristotelian character of these virtues. The fourfold pattern of virtues, Gifts, Beatitudes and Fruits is first set out in the preamble to the topic of virtue, ST 1a2ae, q.55, pr., "Primo dicendum est de habitibus bonis, qui sunt virtutes et alia eis adiuncta, scilicet dona, beatitudines et fructus.

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5 Aquinas introduces the Gift of Courage in ST 2a2ae, q.139, a.1, at the conclusion of his treatment of the virtue of courage. Since Courage and certain other non-Aristotelian attributes have homonymous counterparts among the virtues in Aquinas’s network, I capitalize references to these attributes.

6 ST 1a2ae, q.68, a.1, a.3.

7 The specific Gifts are covered in the ST 2a2ae as follows: q.8 (Understanding), q.9 (Knowledge), q.19 (Fear), q.45 (Wisdom), q.52 (Counsel), q.121 (Piety) and q.139 (Courage). Each question on a Gift follows immediately from Aquinas’s main investigation of the theological or cardinal virtue to which the Gift is appended.

8 ST 1a2ae, q.68, a.2; a.8; ST 2a2ae, q.19, a.9, ad 4.

9 ST 1a2ae, q.68, a.3; ST 1a2ae, q.68, a.1; see also ST 2a2ae, q.45, a.3.

10 I explain the connection between the Gifts and the second person in “Gifts and Fruits,” The Oxford Handbook to Thomas Aquinas, edited by Eleonore Stump and Brian Davies, due to be published later this year by Oxford University Press. I am grateful to Eleonore Stump for first drawing my attention to the Gifts and other non-Aristotelian attributes of ST 2a2ae, qq.1-170.

11 ST 2a2ae q.129, a.1, ad 2, incidentally not a.2, as described in the citation in the book (227).

12 See, for example, Aquinas’s commentary on the Gospel of John, In Jn 4:7; 5:1.