Thomas Aquinas on Virtue

Aquinas On Virtue

Thomas M. Osborne, Jr. Thomas Aquinas on Virtue, Cambridge University Press, 2022. 233pp. $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781316511749.

Reviewed by Rebecca K. DeYoung, Calvin University


In this book, Thomas Osborne offers a detailed commentary on the questions on virtue in Aquinas’s Summa theologiae I–II, qq. 55–67. Following Aquinas’s own order of inquiry, the chapters cover

  • the definition of virtue (as a species of habit distinct from other dispositions, which concerns action (“operation”), and which admits both divine and human causes),
  • reasons for distinguishing intellectual and moral virtue (based on developments of Aristotelian faculty psychology and different parts of Aristotle’s definition of virtue as a quality that “makes the agent and the act good” (46, 212) to distinguish types of virtue and levels of perfection),
  • divisions between the moral virtues (including their basis in the passions, different ways of distinguishing the cardinal virtues from each other, and gradations of their perfection),
  • natural and supernatural virtue (cardinal and theological, acquired and infused),
  • properties of virtue (the mean, the connection of the virtues, their rank order or “equality”, and their duration after this life).

The last chapter (chapter 6) identifies potential points of dissonance between Aquinas’s treatment of the virtues and contemporary virtue theories, and between Aquinas’s thought and the naturalistic assumptions of most contemporary philosophical positions. The book’s conclusion (211–217) outlines the ways Osborne’s intentionally “contextual” reading has illuminated the particular topics of each chapter. If I had to give the reader one piece of advice before digging into individual chapters, it would be to read the conclusion first. The picture of Aquinas’s contribution there motivates the rest of the book well.

Osborne’s greatest contribution in this book is his careful exegesis of Aquinas’s texts, with attention to its historical context and engagement with authorities from the preceding tradition. As Osborne notes at the beginning and end of the book (1, 5, 210, 211), this is his main objective. Throughout, he signals the ways in which the discussion of virtue in the Summa is a dialectical engagement with authorities in the philosophical and theological traditions Aquinas has inherited. Osborne’s treatment of topics in each chapter helps the reader see which of Aquinas’s assumptions are driven by his Aristotelian and Augustinian commitments, which are prompted by controversies between Aristotle and the Stoics, which are complicated by what he says in other texts of his own, and which theological concerns are in play because of positions taken by church fathers or controversies being debated among his contemporaries. The book gives the reader a masterful case study in how medieval philosophy is done and how this methodology shapes the matter at hand.

Besides this larger methodological point, the greatest benefit of the book is a clear categorization of the various types of virtues in Aquinas’s thought—intellectual and moral, acquired and infused, imperfect and perfect. Those familiar with controversies about acquired and infused virtues, for example, will find the secondary literature duly footnoted, along with a twelve-page bibliography in the back of the book. Osborne’s text, however, stays focused on unpacking the primary text and explaining the relevant distinctions. Detailed attention to the primary text keeps any argumentative edges and debates in the secondary literature below the surface. Osborne’s reader can expect an erudite commentary, like a masterclass on how to read a particular medieval text well—both line-by-line and framed by other relevant texts. Readers who prefer stronger evaluative conclusions or critical engagement with different interpretations may not be content with (merely) a deeper dive into “Thomas’s account of virtue [. . .] considered in its historical and intellectual context” (211). For example, Osborne keeps both Aquinas’s Aristotelianism and his Augustinianism in play, not focusing on his philosophy at the expense of his theology or vice versa. 

The account of Aquinas presented here will have the most benefit for readers already familiar with medieval philosophy. Prior knowledge of Aristotle, Augustine, the Stoics, and other medieval sources (e.g., Lombard’s Sentences), as well as working knowledge of Latin terms (synderesis, ultimum potentiae), and Aquinas’s general metaphysics and faculty psychology are prerequisites for digesting Osborne’s analysis and its implications. Scholars who already care about historical accounts of virtue, are interested in distinctions between types of virtue, or who find Aquinas’s treatment of virtue compelling will find a rich resource here. I would not expect the book to change anyone’s mind about whether Aquinas has something to contribute to contemporary philosophical conversations about virtue (chapter 6). His account of virtue explicitly incorporates theological assumptions and addresses theological concerns, is based on an Aristotelian essentialist metaphysical paradigm, and seems inseparable from a eudaimonistic and teleological account of human nature. To a significant extent, these fundamental, formative features of Aquinas’s account mean that a case for its “relevance to most contemporary philosophers” will be something of a non-starter. (In that respect, chapter 6 felt like something the editors insisted on, rather than an organic part of the main project.) Osborne’s book may contribute to the larger case that Aquinas gives us “one of the more defensible versions of Aristotelian ethics” and Aquinas’s thought constitutes “a plausible overall approach” to moral virtue (217), but alone it does not make that case. Nor does that seem to be Osborne’s main aim or preoccupation throughout most of the book. He seems simply to want people to understand Aquinas better, and he succeeds in that task.

The first five chapters of expert analysis will appeal to Aquinas scholars, those interested in medieval philosophy, and those invested in tracking the legacy of Aristotelian and Augustinian ideas in history. Understanding Aquinas’s account contextually and dialectically—i.e., the ways “he responds to and develops issues raised by his predecessors and contemporaries,” both philosophical and theological, the ways he “incorporates moral philosophy into his theology”, and the ways “his later discussions depend on ones [in earlier questions]” (211)—will serve this audience well. That’s a somewhat blander project, perhaps, and one less appealing to non-Aquinas scholars or contemporary philosophers interested in moral virtue. Some philosophers aren’t and won’t ever be interested in the history of philosophy. In my opinion, that’s not a reason to devalue Osborne’s contribution. My point is simply that the book’s strengths are more exegetical than polemical.

I wish, nonetheless, that the specific examples in the “Conclusion” had been foregrounded more powerfully or incorporated into the book’s chapters more explicitly throughout. Those last few pages (211–217) comprise the most interesting payoff moments of the book, showing the difference it makes to read Aquinas in conversation with, say, Aristotle or Augustine or the Stoics on a particular point. Offering a careful reading of Aquinas (or any medieval philosopher) “in context” is valuable, to be sure. All medieval philosophers need to be read as being in conversation with the relevant authorities in the tradition, and on a wide range of topics beyond virtue. Why is that a compelling reason to read this historical figure, or these questions on this topic? The reader might be more motivated to dig into Aquinas’s text question by question if they had a better sense of what particular insights they stood to gain from it. In the conclusion, Osborne shows the reader why reading Aquinas contextually matters for each specific topic treated in previous chapters. In what way does the Aristotelian distinction between making an agent good and her acts good matter for Aquinas’s parsing of various types of virtues? How should our conclusions about what makes virtue perfect or imperfect rely not just on this part of the Summa but on Aquinas’s other texts on virtue? How do the different elements of his definition of virtue instructively balance philosophy and theology, Aristotle and Augustine? How does the addition of supernatural ends and virtues require Aquinas to be an innovative developer of Aristotle’s thought? (Perhaps further afield from the book’s main expository aim, how does this text support a case for seeing Aquinas as an expert dialectician, of the sort we might learn from? Or, how does reading Aquinas help us imagine how conversations about virtue might be differently shaped if we appreciatively appropriated inherited traditions of thought, rather than prizing originality?)

Osborne knows the Thomistic corpus, medieval texts, and contemporary conversations about Aquinas’s texts thoroughly. It shows in this volume. I wish his editors at Cambridge had honored his expertise with better editing—the book has too many residual copyediting errors, from typographical mistakes (missing apostrophes, misspelled words, wrong numbers) to wrong or additional words (“hope” instead of “joy,” 22; an extra “is,” 215), making its sentences harder to understand. Also of note: not one of Aquinas’s interlocutors is a woman; Osborne’s bibliography improves on that by about ten percentage points. 

Osborne holds that “Thomas’s account of virtue is important both historically and for its own philosophical and even theological interest” (217). To that end, his book offers a tour of Aquinas’s thought on virtue in this section of the Summa, paying close attention to the figures Aquinas took to be important philosophical and theological conversation partners in that text. Who we take as interlocutors and authorities shapes our frameworks and assumptions in both philosophy and theology, as well as the conclusions we draw from them. Osborne’s reading illustrates the significance of this point for reading Aquinas well. Whether it points us forward to take Aquinas as our own interlocutor on virtue would be an argument for a different book.