Thomas Aquinas on War and Peace

Placeholder book cover

Gregory M. Reichberg, Thomas Aquinas on War and Peace, Cambridge University Press, 2016, 302pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107019904.

Reviewed by G. Scott Davis, University of Richmond


Given the many avatars of Aquinas stalking the contemporary stage -- from the quasi-Kantian of John Finnis to James Turner Johnson's Augustinian to Richard Miller's crypto-pacifist -- it is good to have an overview grounded in the full spectrum of St. Thomas's works, informed as well by his early modern commentators and contemporary critics. Gregory M. Reichberg is doubtless correct that understanding the scope of Thomas's work and its historical development are essential to grasping what he is up to in his various discussions of war and peace. I'll say a bit about how much and what sort of historical stage-setting is essential in a moment.[1]

The book has two parts. The first "was written as a single unit," in which Reichberg traces Thomas's attempt to reconcile "the Gospel 'precepts of patience' with the necessity of just war." (ix) This is, he points out,

a theme that Aquinas took up repeatedly during his second Parisian regency (1268-1272), in contrast to the preceding years when this theme was rarely mentioned . . . although the 'Quaestio de bello' is its most obvious manifestation, evidence of this engagement is visible elsewhere in the Summa theologiae, in his Biblical commentaries, as well as in at least one quodlibetal question. (ix)

Reichberg does not pursue issues of biography, and this is a first point where historical setting turns out to be important. From 1265 on Thomas undertook the systematic revision of theological pedagogy in his order, commenting systematically on Aristotle and conceiving the shape of the Summa theologiae as a comprehensive introduction to the truths of the Catholic Church for beginners. (ST, prooemium) This is essential for training the members of his order for their greatest tasks, preaching the Gospel and clarifying the consciences of their pastoral charges. The subtle distinctions of the lawyers and theologians can only come later. When Thomas's great interpreter Francisco de Vitoria opens his advanced lecture on the Indies with doubts about the standing of lawyers, he follows Thomas in claiming the high ground for an Aristotelian reading of justice and the demands of conscience, informed by the distinctively Christian virtues of faith, hope, and charity. Taken together they give us the vocabulary for understanding the permissibility of war, the virtue of patience, military prudence, and battlefield courage, the topics of chapters two through five. With regard to the last, for example, an understanding of Aristotle on hitting the mean is essential to distinguishing courage from recklessness (93), and the positive importance of anger in the pursuit of justice. The "Stoics," Reichberg points out, "failed to understand that anger can also be consequent of reason . . . assuring a prompt and efficacious execution of rational decision." (97)

The second part has six chapters, most of which "were originally written as stand-alone essays and have been revised for inclusion." (x) Although they have a certain unity, these chapters reflect the adversarial atmosphere of the academic journal more than a systematic expansion of the interpretation of part one. Reichberg's interlocutors include precisely those other readers of Aquinas with whom he stands in competition. The topics of Part II -- authority, punishment, self-defense, preventive war, the immunity of non-combatants -- are the lynchpins of contemporary debate, even when they are not part of the medieval or early modern vocabulary. Taken as a whole, they allow Reichberg to develop a reading of the tradition that points not to the virtue-centered reading of Part I, but rather a legal model, consistent with the Catholic magisterial tradition that rules from Gratian in the 12th century to present. Even though "restraint" has come to characterize some recent writing, ". . . Pope Francis has urged military action to halt atrocities perpetrated in Syria and Iraq by the group calling itself 'the Islamic State'." (274)

In calling Part I "Just War in Aquinas's Typology of the Virtues," Reichberg echoes Thomas's statement in the prooemium to ST IIaIIae, that "generalizations about ethics are minimally useful, since acts are always about particulars." He rightly insists on the unity of the Summa and the importance of locating the discussion of war under the theological virtue of charity, love of God and neighbor. Here, "Aristotle's idea that 'politics are held together by friendship' was made operative . . . at two different levels." (23-24) Fresh from commenting on Aristotle's Ethics, Thomas merges the individual and group friendships discussed by the Philosopher with the communities of neighbors that, were it not for the Fall, would have been the objects of our concern. Unfortunately, given our sinfulness, instead of enjoying the fruits of charity -- joy, peace, and mercy -- we are regularly tempted into vices against individuals, ourselves and our neighbors -- hatred, sloth, and envy -- and against the peace of the community, "first discord, which is in the heart, then contention, which is of the mouth, and finally acts, including schism, brawling, and war." (ST IIaIIae, 37, prooemium) This way of putting it, which does not quite match the ultimate order of questions, makes the progression from internal to external act clear, and highlights the work of charity in rectifying the situation.

This makes it much easier to explain the mistake of those who find the placement of war under charity confusing. Richard Miller, in particular, has argued that locating the discussion of war under the aegis of charity "demonstrates bias in favor of nonviolence." (34) This is simply misguided. Placing it where he does allows Thomas "to strike a delicate balance. Had the Quaestio been placed within the treatise on justice, the theme of punishment would have taken center stage." (40) This would have taken the emphasis off of the more important Christian virtues of love and friendship, which provide the positive motion to the act. Nonetheless, Reichberg risks misleading the reader when he writes that "within the 'Quaestio de bello' Aquinas never posits just war specifically as an act of charity." (40) This seems to me to concede too much to Miller. Thomas doesn't need to be explicit about this since he has already remarked, in the context of faith, that "Christians often go to war against non-believers . . . so that they do not harass the faith of Christ." (IIaIIae, 10, 8) It is hard to see such a war as anything but an act of charity, protecting the integrity of the Christian community against the malice of non-believers. In fact, Thomas suggests, this is the only good reason to go to war against them. There is no need to repeat.

It occasionally seems that Reichberg is motivated by the modern suspicion that war in general is not just tragic, but wicked. This accounts, I think, for his surprising sympathy with Jeff McMahan, who "finds himself in continuity -- accurately in my opinion -- with the older approach to just war as may be found in the classical theorists . . . If enough warriors refuse to fight in unjust wars, it will become harder for leaders to initiate such wars, resulting in a less war-prone world." (145) Fair enough, I suppose, but to denigrate the goodness of a just war is to run counter to Aquinas and the tradition that follows his understanding. When, in ST IIaIIae, 188, Thomas applauds the work of the military orders, it is because their actions are directed toward to protection of their neighbors and the service of God. Specifically, the soldier dedicated to the active spiritual life protects not only the individual neighbor, "but even the defense of the entire republic." (ST, IIaIIae, 188, 3) It is simply mistaken to suggest that "the robust military role assigned to these religious knights [seems] inconsistent with the division of labor established by St. Thomas in his commentary on Matt 5:39." (61) Even if the notoriously defective text of the commentary reflects Thomas's genuine thought on the work of the civil authorities, the discussion of the military orders simply expands on the scope of what counts as the active life among the religious orders.

Such disagreements in detail and emphasis multiply exponentially when we turn to the second part of the book. Those, myself included, who see Thomas as an almost orthodox Aristotelian, read the tradition as beginning with the articulation of human moral psychology in terms of habits, trained into virtues, which then allow individuals and communities to achieve reasonable ends. The Christian, having received the theological virtues, sees life anew, in terms of a supernatural end. This creates new possibilities -- witness the military orders -- and a deeper commitment to the good of all neighbors, near and far. In the early modern period it is the so-called "Second Scholastic," dominated by Vitoria and Soto, which follows Thomas in deploying the vocabulary of the virtues for understanding our common life. On this reading, the expanding impact of the "legal paradigm" represents not only an alternative understanding of communal life, but one potentially corrosive of virtue. The villain of the story, from this perspective, is Grotius. Reichberg himself cites the work of Richard Tuck, who writes of Grotius that, "Far from being an heir to the tradition of Vitoria and Suarez . . . he was in fact an heir to the tradition Vitoria most distrusted, that of humanist jurisprudence." (210, n. 38) Suarez and Molina become intermediate figures presaging the collapse of the Aristotelian tradition. Tuck writes in the tradition of Quentin Skinner, who taught students of ethics and politics that it is a mistake to look for timeless philosophical questions, equally compelling across times and places. When it comes to understanding the rise of the legal paradigm, the social and economic history of Europe and the Mediterranean basin, from the 11th century to the 17th, is essential; the historians with whom to conjure include not just the fathers of the Annales, but more recent giants such as Duby and Cipolla.

Reichberg is having none of it. His bibliography is heavy with students of canon, "natural," and international law, but social and economic history pop up much more irregularly. He relies throughout on the work of the Hungarian-Swiss lawyer and legal historian Peter Haggenmacher. The method here is oddly reminiscent of the New Criticism of the 1930s and '40s. Everything turns on subtle connections between loaded technical terms. Something of the use to which Reichberg puts this approach emerges in the following passage:

Grotius significantly reverts to a similarly broad connotation of the term culpa, using it as an equivalent for delictum. Thus he writes that 'any sort of fault (qualiscumque culpa) may frequently be sufficient to give rise to a liability (obligation) for damages inflicted . . . By appealing to this original right of nature, Grotius could explain how one prince might exercise the sword of war over another, even in the absence of any special jurisdiction. (170-171)

This is recognizably the language of the courtroom. It deploys the technical language of legal professionals to carve out a justification for intervention and subjection of a defendant, regardless of jurisdiction. In its origins, Grotius deployed this sort of reasoning to justify the Dutch taking of a Portuguese treasure on the open sea. But it also subverts the argument of Vitoria against the duplicitous justifications of the Spanish for taking the lands and treasure of the Native Americans. Reichberg thinks this reflects the complexity of just war debate. It stems, he maintains, from the fact that "the just war doctrine of Thomas Aquinas occupies an ambiguous position." (172) This ambiguity is generated, the Aristotelian reading maintains, only because of an anachronistic reading of later legal language into a decidedly non-legalist moral tradition. Neither Aristotle, Aquinas, nor Vitoria expresses any worry about whether to employ "the penal conception" or a "liabilist reading" of justice in analyzing war. In this tradition, to paraphrase Aristotle, to fail to render each person that person's due is to do injustice; to render each person that person's due is justice. Everything else smacks of the machinations, as Tuck might say, of "humanist jurisprudence."

One of the great benefits of Reichberg's approach is that it places these methodological issues in the study of Thomas, and in the study of ethical and political thought generally, center stage. The first part is the best account so far of why it is important to appreciate the centrality of the virtues, and the importance of charity, in understanding Aquinas on just war. The topics of part two highlight the lively disagreement across the spectrum of those working on war and justice. I have tried to highlight the historical contingency of the legal language that Reichberg favors and I have tried to suggest that it is a language the Aristotelian tradition is indisposed to embrace. Each chapter of the second part generates similar interpretive disputes. But that means that each chapter presents an opportunity to push further along the road of moral inquiry. That's a good thing.

[1] It is a bit surprising that Reichberg doesn't introduce the reader to the now indispensable Corpus Thomisticum, with its complete list of genuine and spurious works, best editions, and fully searchable index. No doubt he assumes everyone working on Aquinas is aware of the Corpus, but the general reader will surely profit from perusing its riches.

Despite his valuable bibliography on Aquinas and the laws of war, Reichberg doesn't offer much for the uninitiated. I offer the following supplements, though the choice is mine and not necessarily compatible with all of Reichberg's readings: Romanus Cessario, A Short History of Thomism, Catholic University of America Press, 2005; Marie-Dominique Chenu, Aquinas and His Role in Theology, trans. Philibert, Liturgical Press, 2002; Herbert McCabe, On Aquinas, Burns and Oates, 2008; Bernard McGinn, Thomas Aquinas's Summa theologiae: A Biography, Princeton University Press, 2014; Ralph McInerny, Ethica Thomistica: The Moral Philosophy of Thomas Aquinas, rev. ed., Catholic University of America Press, 1997; Jean-Pierre Torrell, Aquinas's Summa: Background, Structure, and Reception, trans. Guevin, Catholic University of America Press, 2005. In what follows, ST stands for Summa theologiae. Part, question, and article are typically indicated, for example, as follows: IIaIIae, 40, 1, which reads, "the second part of the second part, question 40, article 1."