Thomas Aquinas's Summa Contra Gentiles: A Guide and Commentary

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Brian Davies, Thomas Aquinas's Summa Contra Gentiles: A Guide and Commentary, Oxford University Press, 2016, 485pp., $45.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780190456542.

Reviewed by Joseph Stenberg, Humboldt-Universität zu Berlin


This book gives one the feeling of being in the presence of a talented and experienced teacher, who brings Thomas Aquinas's Summa Contra Gentiles (SCG) to life for his students. For students and especially for teachers of Aquinas's philosophy and theology, Brian Davies' guide and commentary is a gift.

The book is intended as a comprehensive introduction to the SCG. So, after a preface and a bit of background, Davies's commentary takes up virtually every topic discussed in the order in which the SCG covers it. So the commentary treats, e.g., God's existence and attributes, God's activity in creating and sustaining the world, the nature of intellectual creatures, good and evil, happiness, divine providence, the Trinity, the Incarnation, the sacraments of the Catholic Church, and the life of the world to come. As a result, the majority of what is discussed bears most directly on the philosophy of religion and philosophical theology.

Each chapter focuses on some continuous stretch of text from one of the four books that constitute the SCG. For example, Chapter 6 focuses on Book 1, sections 37-43, which treat of God's goodness, oneness, and infinity. The first and longer chunk of each chapter is almost entirely expository and it is clear that Davies' main goal is to help the reader quickly come to understand what Aquinas is claiming about the matter at hand. A second, shorter chunk of each chapter is devoted to evaluating what Aquinas has said. This takes a variety of forms. Often, it involves considering objections informed by modern science or later philosophical theorizing. In these sections, Davies gives the impression that one is privy to a lively philosophical and theological dialogue in which Aquinas participates along with everyone from Marilyn McCord Adams to Wittgenstein to Hume to Richard Swinburne. And, often, Davies very intentionally invites the reader to join in, for example, saying, after rejecting one of Aquinas's arguments as insufficient, "You, of course, might think differently" (197).

Some readers may be surprised by the diversity of issues and authors discussed in the sections which evaluate Aquinas's arguments and positions. For example, in considering whether Aquinas was right to engage in natural theology, Davies considers the following four worries:

(1) There could never be any good natural theology since the assertion 'God exists' is not even possibly true or since its truth is highly unlikely; (2) It is not the job of philosophy to argue that God exists. All philosophers can do is explain what belief in God amounts to; (3) To engage in natural theology is to offend against God by preferring to rely on human reasoning rather than divine revelation; (4) The whole enterprise of natural theology stands condemned on biblical grounds (26).

The subsequent discussion draws upon everyone from philosophers such as A. J. Ayer and D. Z. Phillips to the biblical scholar, James Barr, to the First Vatican Council of the Catholic Church and the Psalms.

In the expository sections of each chapter, Davies' prowess as a teacher is especially apparent. The text is thick with wonderful and lively examples and analogies that enliven and clarify the issues at hand. For example, in explaining Aquinas's views on the need for the sacraments of the Church, Davies compares the sacraments, which help us to remain united to God, to the sorts of behaviors necessary for sustaining a good marriage (365). Davies also makes a point of clearly explaining the most important jargon without intimidating the reader. For example, in his discussion of the Incarnation, Davies spends a paragraph explaining what Aquinas means by 'hypostasis' and he does so by talking about computers, prime ministers, and cats (329-30). There are also fun tidbits scattered throughout the text that add another layer of interest for the reader. For example, Davies quotes Martin Luther's assessment that, given Aquinas's treatment of the Eucharist, Aquinas seems to know "neither [Aristotle's] philosophy nor his logic" since "Aristotle speaks of substance and accidents so very differently from St. Thomas" (quoted on 370).

Davies also repeatedly shows his good teacherly judgment. For example, that judgment shines through in when and how Davies quotes Aquinas. There seems to be a very real effort to quote Aquinas frequently and sometimes at length, but never before the reader is solidly in a position to understand everything that Aquinas is saying. Also, Davies shows an awareness that some material covered in the SCG will be of interest only to experts. So, for example, citing the fact that he suspects that the topic is "only of interest to specialists in the history of philosophy" (234), he refrains from going through every element of Aquinas's treatment of whether we can understand angels in this life and focuses instead on "where it leads Aquinas" (234).

The list seems to be one of Davies' favorite teaching tools. To name the most frequent varieties, there are lists of arguments, objections, replies, and main claims. These lists allow Davies to cover a lot of ground quickly. Sometimes these lists go on for pages. For example, there is a 26-item list of Aquinas's responses to arguments against the suitability of the Incarnation that runs over three pages in length (360-3). There are almost always a number of substantial lists in the same chapter -- for example, Chapter 18 has eight lists, which take up approximately 13 pages of text.

Depending on who is reading the text, the lists may be either a boon or a drawback. I could see many of the lists being extremely useful for a teacher trying to quickly come to grips with the material covered in the SCG and especially helpful for a teacher looking for a few arguments or points to focus on from some section or other. On the other hand, for a student (or teacher!) with little background in Aquinas, I imagine that the lists would, at times, be fairly overwhelming. Not infrequently, a list of arguments will include quite technical arguments or arguments that omit premises (presumably to save space). For example, Davies gives the following paraphrase of one of Aquinas's arguments for the conclusion "God is goodness itself": "God's perfection is not something added to God. It is God's very substance. It is what God is" (88). A page and a half before giving this argument, Davies briefly discusses the connections that Aquinas takes to hold between being actual, being perfect, and being good (86). Still, I think that many readers without a background in Aquinas would find it difficult to supply the premises in this and many other similarly shortened arguments.

As one might expect from a book not intended for specialists, the main text avoids the appearance of scholarly disagreement over how to interpret Aquinas. Other interpreters of Aquinas make appearances, such as Herbert McCabe and Eleonore Stump, but always in support of a point already being made. For the most part, I thought Davies was successful in staying above the fray, as it were, by sticking very close to the text. This is true, for example, of his discussion of Aquinas's account of the will's freedom. The notes often make suggestions about secondary literature to consult, but even the notes don't delve deeply into scholarly disagreements about Aquinas's views. I think that, given the book's aims, this is all well and good, but it should be noted that a non-specialist might be led to think wrongly that how we should understand Aquinas on a wide array of issues is an almost entirely settled matter.

I myself had some quibbles about how Aquinas's views on various topics were characterized. For example, in discussing the claim that God is good, Davies goes to some lengths to argue that Aquinas does not think of God as a morally good person (96-8). Although much of what Davies says in support of thinking as much seems right, I fear that that discussion as a whole might mislead some readers. Aquinas thinks that God is characterized by mind and will and so, leaving aside complexities introduced by the doctrine of the Trinity, God is a person in some important sense. He further thinks that "God wills his own good and that of others" and "wills the good of each thing according as it is the good of each thing" (SCG 1,91). Furthermore, Aquinas maintains that God doesn't will what is bad for anything (SCG 1,95-6). Taken together, it doesn't seem particularly strained to say that, although God's being morally good and God's being a person differ in extremely important ways from humans' being those things, God is a morally good person. That said, my quibbles were few and far between. I found Davies a reliable as well as an engaging guide.

I highly recommend this book to those who want an accessible, reliable, and (relatively) quick introduction to Aquinas's SCG, or to Aquinas's work in philosophy of religion and philosophical theology more generally. I think that students of Aquinas and especially teachers of Aquinas stand to benefit greatly from this volume. As much as a book can, with its colorful examples, clear explanations, and evident passion for the topics covered, it gives one the sense of attending a master teacher's course on Aquinas's SCG.