Thomas Hobbes and the Natural Law

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Kody W. Cooper, Thomas Hobbes and the Natural Law, University of Notre Dame Press, 2018, 331pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780268103019.

Reviewed by S.A. Lloyd, University of Southern California


Kody W. Cooper's thesis is that Thomas Hobbes's moral and civil philosophy sits squarely within the Aristotelian-Thomistic tradition of natural law theorizing. Far from providing a modern, secularly-grounded civil philosophy, Hobbes's system depends on men's acknowledging the existence of a single supreme God who creates human nature with an overriding purpose that provides an objective standard of value and principal reason for action, and who governs humans to realize their telos through threats of punishment for the violation of a set of literal laws promulgated to them through their natural reason. Hobbes's theory thus satisfies what Cooper identifies as the two central requirements for a traditional natural law theory: the positing of an unchanging (and knowable) human nature that determines a human good, and the insistence that the requirements to pursue that telos and all necessary means to it "have a legal character".

The Judeo-Christian God plays an essential role in Hobbes's theory not only because "God's command secures the legal character of the laws of nature" (9), and rational animals "are fashioned and ordered [to their purpose] in virtue of their creation by God" (51), but also because "knowledge delivered in sacred history has a crucial place in the ultimate foundation of Hobbes's moral and civil doctrine" (55). "Revelation provides an ultimate foundation [for Hobbes's civil science] because the continued definiteness and unchangeableness of human nature for Hobbes depends on Christian teaching that the potentiality for evil is ineradicable" absent salvation (91). Because, says Cooper, human reason reveals God's law that men must pursue an objective good regardless of their desires, but postlapsarian reason is no longer determinative of human action, the potentiality for evil is ineradicable.

Thus all interpretations of Hobbes's political philosophy that sever its derivation from these deep theological and metaphysical truths, and truths of revealed Judeo-Christian religion, are mistaken. Hobbes's civil philosophy is not "political" in John Rawls's sense of political as not dependent on controversial comprehensive doctrines. Nor is it derivable, pace Hobbes, by "right reasoning" from settled definitions and uncontroversial premises provided by introspection. Cooper proposes to set aside Hobbes's own mechanistic, materialistic metaphysics, according to which all that exists is body, and every cause communicates motion mechanically to the effect it causes, allowing natural reason's inquiry into causes to arrive only at the speculation that there must have been some eternally moving bodies. Because these could well be mindless cue-balls rather than a purposive God who creates and governs the universe, Cooper needs to exclude Hobbes's actual metaphysics, and turn to revelation to ground the natural law theory he attributes to Hobbes.

Cooper seeks to establish a human telos, yielding the objective standard of morality, using Hobbes's analogy between the commonwealth and a human body. The various elements of a commonwealth interact to give it "life". Magistrates are artificial joints, counsellors are an artificial memory, etc. If Hobbes thinks the purpose of a commonwealth is to stay "alive" and a commonwealth is an imitation of a human, then, Cooper reasons, the telos of a human must be to stay alive, that is, to pursue self-preservation as the primary goal and the only standard for right and wrong action. Whereas earlier natural law tradition drew from the observed natural inclinations of humans to live in community, rear children, pursue truth, engage in marital relations, seek their own life and health, etc. to ascertain the human good, "Hobbes's break from tradition is to lop off the other goods" (100) leaving only self-preservation. Cooper inaptly terms this a "thin" theory of the good, calling to mind Rawls's distinction between thin political conceptions and thick metaphysical conceptions of the good. The conception of the good Cooper attributes to Hobbes, which depends on theological metaphysics, is impoverished rather than thin. Hobbes is otherwise so traditional that "Aquinas would have deduced a similar set of doctrines if he had held a thin theory of the good" (259).

Several key elements of Cooper's thesis are familiar in the Hobbes literature. Bernard Gert famously argued that reason has an end which is bodily self-preservation and health. Cooper embraces Gert's conclusion (while criticizing Gert for not having the theological underpinning he thinks is needed to make good that claim) because he sees that the laws of nature will make a claim on everyone only if they engage a universal motive, and that there is no universal desire that could provide such a motive, hence the need to posit a rational dictate to adopt an end irrespective of desire. He endorses the view of A.P. Martinich, who has mounted the most sustained argument in the literature that Hobbes's natural laws are literally laws in virtue of having been commanded by God to subjects in his natural kingdom. Michael Byron and Rosamond Rhodes have each argued that people come to be subjects in God's natural kingdom simply by believing in the existence of a law-giving God who punishes disobedience, a position Cooper also relies on to lend the natural laws a "legal character" as commands of a sovereign. Each of these views has been rejected by the majority of Hobbes scholars, despite the ingenuity of their defenders.

The textual barriers to establishing Cooper's thesis are formidable, likely insurmountable. He does not acknowledge some of the most challenging of these recalcitrant texts, perhaps being unaware of them. Others he buries in footnotes, notably Hobbes's insistence "once for all" that prior to their confirmation by revelation, the natural laws "are but theorems . . . and therefore not properly laws" (302). Some he dismisses as "obfuscations" (238), suggesting that perhaps Hobbes was either, in his critic Bramhall's words, inconsistent and "irreconcilable with himself" or else "in his own words, a forgetful blockhead"(240, 302).  What Hobbes wrote is that Bramhall thinks Hobbes is a forgetful blockhead. Hobbes applies the insult "blockhead" not to himself, but to the originators of School-divinity, Peter Lombard and John Scot of Duns, whom, he wrote, would be judged by any reader unaware of their political design to advance the Pope's authority and encroach upon the rights of kings "to have been two of the most egregious blockheads in the world, so obscure and senseless are their writings" (Behemoth, EW VI p. 214). 

Cooper begins the book by suggesting that readers must either dismiss as insincere all that Hobbes says about God and religion on the ground that he was an atheist whose religious talk was either intended to be subversive or was merely self-protective deceit, or else must take as sincere and available for use in his moral and civil science everything Hobbes says about God and religion. This is a false choice. Hobbes insists that "philosophy [science] excludes from itself theology, as I call the doctrine about the nature and attributes of the . . . incomprehensible God" (De Corpore 1.8), and, as a method of establishing conditional knowledge from definitions (Lev V.17), excludes the use of beliefs taken on testimony or authority -- including all those comprising revealed religion (Lev. VII.4, 5, 7). Our epistemic relation to the Scriptures (as to non-sacred histories) is one of belief, not knowledge (Lev. XXXIII.21). Hobbes may take on faith, and embellish his presentation with, many Christian commonplaces he sincerely shares, while refusing to allow them as premises in his civil science.

Cooper's reliance on the Biblical account of Adam's fall is thus contraband. But even if it had been available for use in a scientific derivation, Cooper's interpretation of it is thwarted by Hobbes's text. Cooper uses the fall to establish a fixed human nature in which the faculty of desire is imperfectly controlled by a faculty of reason that dictates pursuit of bodily self-preservation as the summum bonum. He maintains that although God had exercised ordained power in creating Adam with a faculty of reason that perfectly controlled his desires, when Adam disobeys (quite inexplicably, on Cooper's account, since Adam's reason should have overridden his temptation), God exercises (presumably absolute) power to alter human nature so that men's desires and their reason then become at "cross-purposes". This interpretation is meant to explain his claim that God designs human nature to impose a rational requirement to pursue bodily self-preservation, and on that basis to claim that humans are "ordered to life", despite their competing desires.

However, Hobbes's understanding of the fall (L XXXVIII.2; OL appendix I.48) is radically different, and carries no such implication. God created humans intrinsically mortal -- prone to decay and death -- but so long as Adam ate from the tree of life he would remain healthy and alive. God punished his disobedience in eating from the tree of the knowledge of good and evil by depriving him of access to the tree of life. God's punishment for Adam's rebellion was expulsion from the garden, and consequently, eventual death both for himself and his posterity. It was not, as Cooper posits, to recreate Adam with a new and different nature that made his passions less obedient to reason's demands. It was to continue Adam, and the rest of humanity, in our natural state of mortality without natural access to the means of eternal life. Cooper interprets Hobbes's statement "God by his right might have made men subject to diseases and death, although they had never sinned", to mean, not, as Hobbes does, that God rightfully afflicts men regardless of their sin, but rather that God did not create men subject to diseases and death. Cooper writes, "we know what in fact God willed inasmuch as that is apparent in his . . . natural kingdom [that] God orders man not toward death but toward life" (156). Hobbes sees men as by their human nature corruptible and mortal.

Cooper's contention that civil science depends on people's knowledge of their being subjects in a natural kingdom ruled by a God who threatens punishment for violation of his laws, is belied by Hobbes's placement of his chapters and his commentary on their place in his argument. Were knowledge of one's status as a subject of a providential, penal God necessary to the derivation of his political science, Hobbes ought to have placed any chapter purporting to establish such knowledge prior to that demonstration, and so should have placed the content of Chapter 31 of Leviathan in Chapter 12 on natural religion as a necessary premise in his derivation of the duty to submit to government that he offers in Chapters 13 through 15. Instead, Hobbes introduces his discussion of the natural kingdom of God in Chapter 31 by writing: "that subjects owe to sovereigns simple obedience in all things wherein their obedience is not repugnant to the laws of God I have sufficiently proved in that which I have already written" (Lev. XXI.1). Here Hobbes declares that he has proved his civil science already, before any consideration of God's natural kingdom. It follows that Hobbes does not take proof of that science to depend on the considerations of God's natural kingdom he has yet to offer.

Much of Cooper's argument depends on attributing to Hobbes the view that every healthy adult arrives at the belief in God as the designer and governor of the universe. Yet Hobbes explicitly denies it, writing that "without special assistance from God, it proved almost impossible to avoid the twin rocks of atheism and superstition . . . so that the greater part of mankind has readily succumbed to idolatry" (DCv XVI.1).

As for my contention that God's existence [as "some eternal cause" OL XI.25] can be known by natural reason, this must be taken not as if I thought that all men can know it -- unless they think it follows that because Archimedes discovered by natural reason the proportion of a sphere to a cylinder, any Tom, Dick or Harry could have done the same . . . [God's existence] cannot be known by men who are constantly in pursuit of pleasure, wealth or honour, nor by those who do not have the habit, the ability or the concern to reason correctly. (DCv XIV.19 note)

By this account, the overwhelming majority of men cannot discover the existence even of "some eternal cause" which men "call God". And none can discover the existence of a designing and governing God, because "they cannot have any idea of him in their mind answerable to his nature" (L XI.25), and the terms we use in speaking of God are mere honorifics and not descriptors, God being utterly incomprehensible (L XXXIV.4).

Cooper's interpretation of Hobbes as a traditional natural law theorist requires Hobbes's laws of nature to be literal laws, meaning, by Hobbes's definition of law, that they are commands to those persons previously obligated to obey the commander, whose obedience is motivated by threatened punishments. Yet Hobbes denies that we have natural knowledge of divine punishments, and he asserts that absent revelation, the natural laws are mere precepts of prudence rather than literal laws (L. XV.41, EW IV, 284-5).

Cooper's claim that a sovereign's iniquitous commands contrary to the requirements of peace or subjects' self-preservation "fail to achieve the status of civil law" because, being authorized only to pursue those ends, in issuing them "he is not acting as sovereign" (242) is also undermined by Hobbes's text. Cooper needs to establish this "content-based limitation" on civil law in order to have Hobbes conform to the feature of a natural law theory that civil commands that lack "moral validity" are not in fact law (231). However, Hobbes writes that we give unlimited authorization to a sovereign "to do with impugnity whatever it chooses . . . at its own discretion -- and may do all of this by right" as if saying "I give you the right to command whatever you wish" (DCv VI.13); and a "sovereign may make laws . . . which he ought not to command; and yet when they are commanded, they are Laws" (L XLII.106).

Hobbes's texts also prove to be in tension with Cooper's claim that reason dictates an ultimate human end; Hobbes insists that there is no "summum bonum" nor "finis ultimus" as earlier philosophers maintained (L XI.1). Cooper's claim that reason dictates an alpha-end of bodily self-preservation is challenged by Hobbes's insistence that subjects are "right to refuse" even those of the sovereign's commands that carry capital punishment in response to the demands of familial duty or honor, for "no one . . . is obliged to do something worse than death" such as to act dishonorably and so "live in infamy and loathing" (DCv VI.13). Cooper's claim that the objective standard for goodness is self-preservation is incompatible with Hobbes's actual definition of good: "good and evil are names . . . of what is conformable or disagreeable to reason in the actions of common life" (L XV.40). Hobbes points out that personal excellences that conduce to self-preservation but may actually work against the common good -- such as courage, fortitude, and temperance -- are not good. Hence good cannot be just what conduces to self-preservation.

It is remarkable that Cooper's entire edifice rests on a lone remark Hobbes makes in the letter of dedication attached to De Cive. This remark never appears in the argument of any of Hobbes's works; not in Elements of Law nor De Cive nor the English or Latin Leviathan nor anywhere else. Hobbes writes in that letter that one certain postulate of human nature is "the postulate of natural reason, by which each man strives to avoid violent death as the supreme evil in nature", which Cooper interprets to mean that reason imposes a necessary end of its own. The difficulty is that all of Hobbes's discussions of the operation of reason identify it as "nothing but" a "calculative" faculty that operates on definitions to "add and subtract names in our affirmations" (L V.1, 2). Reason discovers means to ends provided by passions. "The passions that incline men to peace are fear of death, desire of such things as are necessary to commodious living, and a hope by their industry to attain them" (L. XIII.14), he says, and reason then suggests “convenient articles of peace” in the laws of nature (Lev. XIII.14)

Cooper's foundational reliance on a controversial interpretation of what was evidently a one-off remark by Hobbes outside his formal presentations of his theory raises the issue of interpretive methodology. Cooper eclectically assembles arguments from fragments of text drawn from a nearly a dozen of Hobbes's works, sometimes combining quotes from different works in a single assertion, without any apparent interpretive ordering principle nor attention to what Deborah Baumgold has identified as Hobbes's practice of serial composition of his political theory. He draws on a vast array of secondary literature including neurobiological studies of addiction, the computer science behind Deep Blue, and Abraham Lincoln's First Inaugural Address. His treatment of the Hobbes secondary literature is uneven; sometimes careful, but less than charitable in the cases of Springborg, Deigh, McNeilly, Kavka, and others. An extreme example is his argument that Hobbes would judge McNeilly and Deigh guilty of a criminal offense against the natural law for "offering forth for our assent" their definitivist interpretations of Hobbes’s moral theory (168).  Cooper himself deploys the sort of scholastic distinctions and imprecise language Hobbes found objectionable because involving category mistakes or undefined terms, asserting for example that "being is what colors the theoretical order" (109), and "the substantial reality of being a human substance… is the fundamental ratio of the good life" (103).

Cooper himself deploys the sort of scholastic distinctions and imprecise language Hobbes found objectionable because involving category mistakes or undefined terms, asserting for example that "being is what colors the theoretical order" (109), and "the substantial reality of being a human substance . . . is the fundamental ratio of the good life" (103). Hobbes railed against that sort of talk. Still, Cooper proposes to reclaim Hobbes as himself a scholastic (43). His is the sort of "Empire Strikes Back" book that, not so far from William Wallace's interpretation of Galileo's theory as formed by scholastic philosophy rather than being a repudiation of it, seeks to contain the damage of the rebel by recasting him as no rebel at all.

Who might profit from investing the considerable effort required to parse the proffered arguments of this book? Maybe those whose primary interest and expertise lies in natural law theory, who are interested in exploring the outer limits of its malleability. Perhaps those eager to disempower Hobbes's critique of scholastic thought.