Thomas Hobbes and the Politics of Natural Philosophy

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Stephen J. Finn, Thomas Hobbes and the Politics of Natural Philosophy, Continuum, 2006, 192pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 0826486428.

Reviewed by Susanne Sreedhar, Tulane University


In his new book, Thomas Hobbes and the Politics of Natural Philosophy, Stephen J. Finn undertakes an ambitious task. He sets out, in his words, to "reverse" the widely accepted interpretation of the relationship between Hobbes's natural philosophy and his political philosophy (p. 4). As the title suggests, the main thesis of this book is that Hobbes's natural philosophy has a 'politics.' That is, according to Finn, Hobbes's natural philosophy is best understood as, in some important sense, fundamentally political -- a result of the influence of Hobbes's political ideas. Finn initially defines Hobbes's natural philosophy as his "views on geometry and physics, and his account of human sensation and voluntary motion" (p. 11). But it becomes clear as the book progresses that Finn also means to include Hobbes's views on metaphysics, epistemology, philosophy of language, philosophy of mind, and the nature of human reason in this definition. Finn claims that this broadly defined natural philosophy is influenced by Hobbes's political agenda, "the practical political goals he was trying to accomplish," and Hobbes's political philosophy, "the theoretical goals of his political science" (p. 66).

Finn begins by characterizing what he calls the "traditional interpretation of influence," according to which Hobbes's natural philosophy is "logically and systematically" prior to his political philosophy (p. 45). That is, Hobbes's political philosophy is influenced by his natural philosophy, not the other way around. It is widely accepted that Hobbes was influenced greatly by his exposure to the "new sciences" that were blossoming in the first half of the 17th Century. The advances in mathematics and the natural sciences provided Hobbes with both a substance and a method for his philosophical pursuits. Hobbes's materialistic and mechanistic worldview is evident in many parts of his natural philosophy, from his metaphysics to his account of voluntary action. For Hobbes, life is simply matter in motion and even the most complex human behavior can be explained in terms of the mechanical workings of the internal motions of human beings. As such, the "traditional interpretation" follows Hobbes's own description of the order of ideas in his project. Hobbes saw himself as giving a "science of politics" modeled after geometry and geometrical proofs; he first laid out definitions and axioms and then logically deduced political conclusions.

According to Finn, the traditional interpretation is wrong about the role Hobbes's natural philosophy plays in his overall project. Finn's objection to the traditional interpretation is that its adherents make one of two mistakes: they either (1) take Hobbes's natural philosophy to be unrelated to his project in political philosophy or (2) see it as simply providing the preliminaries for his project. The only example of the former Finn offers is Edwin Curley's Introduction to his edition of Leviathan. Here Curley proclaims that Leviathan begins with "topics apparently far removed from the subject of political obedience: the nature of thought, language and science" (p. 59). Now, to say that Curley's comment represents a school of thought in Hobbes scholarship seems hasty. Introductions to editions of primary works are not usually meant to be rigorous, thoroughgoing, and comprehensive interpretive projects. In the absence of other similar references, I find it unconvincing to say that there is a camp of Hobbes scholars who take Hobbes's natural philosophy to be, as Curley puts it, "far removed" from his political philosophy.

Much more common is the second camp, which Finn accuses of dismissing Hobbes's natural philosophy as merely preliminary, or as F.S. McNeilly puts it, "preparatory to the chief arguments" (pp. 59-60). Here, I do think Finn has accurately delineated a genuine theme in Hobbes scholarship (and he has numerous examples from the secondary literature of people who say similar things). However, these scholars do not exactly dismiss Hobbes's natural philosophy, but rather see it as foundational for his larger political project. On Finn's reading, this version of the traditional interpretation sees Hobbes's natural philosophy as politically relevant only because it provides the foundational principles with which Hobbes builds his political philosophy. He argues that it is a mistake to see Hobbes's natural philosophy as simply foundational for his political philosophy -- instead, it is best understood as, in an important sense, a product of his politics. Finn characterizes his own thesis as a rejection of the traditional interpretation insofar as he argues that "political ideas influence and guide Hobbes toward the adoption of certain 'strictly philosophical' views" (p. 66). Thus, Finn argues against the traditional interpretation on the grounds that it is incomplete and misguided in some fundamental way; not only does the traditional interpretation fail to do justice to the relationship between Hobbes's natural philosophy and his political philosophy, but he also charges that it "distorts the real picture" (p. 59).

Finn aims to show that there is an "operative political influence" in Hobbes's natural philosophy, meaning that Hobbes's political views (e.g., his commitment to political absolutism, his insistence on the dangers of democracy and rhetoric used for subversive purposes, and his preference for monarchy) are in some way responsible for his positions in natural philosophy and the seeming inconsistencies those positions sometimes engender (p. 174). Finn's ultimate aim is to provide the best and most charitable interpretation of Hobbes, which he defines as "the most consistent position given the textual evidence, i.e., the one that Hobbes would agree to, assuming the inconsistency was pointed out to him" (p. 177). Others end up concluding that Hobbes's natural philosophy is simply straightforwardly contradictory, or that Hobbes made a series of careless mistakes, or drastically changed his mind as his thinking on such matters evolved. Finn believes that, in contrast, he can account for the apparent inconsistencies in a way that maintains the unity of Hobbes's thought and which Hobbes himself would accept.

Finn has three main lines of argument. His first argument is a chronological one; he points out that Hobbes's political commitments predate his exploration into and thoughts about natural philosophy. Hobbes discovered geometry in 1630 and investigated physics, optics, and related fields later in that decade. But Hobbes's views on the superiority of monarchy and his diagnosis of the causes of civil disorder were mostly established prior to his reflection on the scientific advances of his time. Thus, according to Finn, the traditional interpretation "fails to recognize the implications of the historical priority of the political ideas" (p. 100). Suggestive at best, this argument does not show that Hobbes's natural philosophy should not be understood as logically prior to and foundational for Hobbes's political thought. The fact that Hobbes formed his views on politics before his views on, say, metaphysics does not mean that the latter is a result of the former.

Finn's second argument is an appeal to the political relevance of various aspects of Hobbes's natural philosophy. In short, Finn argues that many tenets of Hobbes's natural philosophy have obvious and direct implications for politics, implications which Hobbes himself repeatedly draws out. Finn interprets Hobbes's rejection of Aristotelian philosophy as a politically motivated move. For example, in arguing against Aristotle's doctrine of "separated essences," Hobbes points out the political danger of this metaphysical position insofar as it was used by some of his contemporaries to explain transubstantiation (p. 90). On Finn's view, Hobbes's anti-Aristotelianism can best be explained as a reaction to the political uses of Aristotle's philosophy by those trying to undermine the political authority of the King. He says, "the philosophical critique of Aristotle's metaphysics is a political attack on the dangerous ideas that inspire religious seducers" (p. 91, see also p. 116).

Finn finds similar political relevance in Hobbes's objections to the views of Descartes. The worry is that Descartes's philosophy is politically subversive in that it encourages seditious beliefs. For example, the idea that the individual can have certain knowledge of God was, for Hobbes, a dangerous one which was, in his own experience, often used to justify disobedience and resistance to the King. Thus, Hobbes's political agenda provided him with good reason to reject Descartes' views and thereby "cut off appeals to immaterial substance" (p. 105). By pointing out ways in which Hobbes can be seen to have had political reasons to reject Aristotelian and Cartesian metaphysics, Finn argues that Hobbes's materialist ontology is a result of his politics.

Finn's third and most important argument for his thesis of an "operative political influence" is that positing such an influence provides the best explanation for a pattern of inconsistencies found in Hobbes's natural philosophy. According to Finn, there are important inconsistencies in Hobbes's account of the nature of truth, his treatment of universals, and his views on human reason. In each case, Finn claims that the inconsistency can best be explained as a result of the influence of Hobbes's politics. In particular, a political influence "leads Hobbes to accept some specific positions in natural philosophy that he has good scientific or logical reasons to reject" (p. 145, italics in original)

For example, Finn argues that while Hobbes purports to give a conventional theory of truth (which holds that the "truth of propositions is established by human agreement"), he also subscribes to a correspondence theory of truth (which holds that "propositions are made true on account of a relationship between propositions and the 'nature of things'") (pp. 40-41 and 137-8, see also pp. 144-146). Finn points out that a conventional view of truth provides theoretical support for Hobbes's political absolutism in that it explains the causes of political disorder as arising from an incorrect attribution of words such as "justice" and "good" and it justifies instituting an absolute sovereign who will be the final definer of such terms in the commonwealth. Thus, Hobbes has political reasons to advocate a conventional theory of truth. However, he has philosophical reasons to reject such a theory and instead subscribe to a correspondence theory of truth. After all, as Finn points out, Hobbes intends his own philosophy to be true in a non-conventional sense. On this reading, Hobbes is committed to the conventional theory of truth for political rather than philosophical reasons. Finn concludes from examples like these that there is a "systematic penetration" (p. 147) of politics into Hobbes's natural philosophy. To be sure, Hobbes does explicate the notion of truth differently in different places. But it does not follow from this that we should read Hobbes's arguments for his more considered view on truth (i.e., the conventional theory) as grounded in a political, as opposed to a philosophical, justification. I'll return to this point below.

In order to evaluate the overall success of this work, let's begin by making a clear distinction between two ways of taking the claim that there is a political influence in Hobbes's natural philosophy. There is the weaker claim that Hobbes's political thought influenced his natural philosophy in the sense that his political commitments made Hobbes more likely to take up certain topics or that particular positions in natural philosophy might have been attractive to Hobbes given his ultimate agenda in political philosophy. I am convinced that Finn has succeeded in making the case for this weaker claim. He does a nice job of pointing out important and interesting connections between Hobbes's natural and political philosophies. For example, it seems reasonable to say that one of the reasons Hobbes spent so much time talking about the nature of language was that he was acutely aware of the ways in which the misuse of language could have socially and politically devastating consequences.

But there is also the stronger claim that Hobbes adopted certain positions in the philosophy of language (and in other areas of natural philosophy) because those positions suited his political purposes. Finn makes it apparent that his project is to show this stronger claim by posing a number of counterfactual questions. For example, he says

[I]f Hobbes had not been concerned with political attacks on Aristotelians, religious seducers and common law lawyers, would he have adopted the same philosophical positions?… Would he have so readily accepted a materialist ontology, which denies the existence of 'visible species,' had it not been for his recognition of the dangerous use of language?… Negative answers to these questions give credence to the thesis that Hobbes's political ideas influence his natural philosophy (p. 121).

On Finn's account, Hobbes could have been an immaterialist if he had not thought materialism was more suitable for his political agenda. The implication here is that Hobbes's grounds for thinking materialism to be true were fundamentally or at bottom political and strategic, not philosophical. This characterization of Hobbes's approach to ontological questions seems a bit odd and lacks sufficient textual support. Hobbes gives no reason to think he had any philosophical leanings toward immaterialism (or Cartesian Dualism or Aristotelian teleology, etc.) but rejected those positions on the grounds that he disliked the politics that followed from them. The fact that a materialist ontology was nicely suited to Hobbes's political philosophy does not entail that Hobbes picked it for that reason or that Hobbes had no independent philosophical reasons for advocating materialism. Moreover, it does not mean that we should take Hobbes's arguments against immaterialism to be grounded in strategic political reasons rather than philosophical ones. On Finn's reading, Hobbes's arguments in natural philosophy appear to be simply ad hoc; but there is no reason why we cannot read Hobbes as giving a genuinely philosophical critique of Aristotelian and Cartesian metaphysics while simultaneously showing an awareness of how those kinds of metaphysical positions were being used politically.

There is another, deeper level at which I am skeptical of Finn's conclusion. Finn intends his interpretation of Hobbes to be the most charitable (he can explain certain inconsistencies without claiming that Hobbes was careless or unskilled as a philosopher) and the one that Hobbes would accept himself were it available to him. But it seems to me that Hobbes would be more than a little hesitant about accepting Finn's conclusion. A political interpretation of Hobbes's arguments in natural philosophy risks making it the case that the reasoning behind Hobbes's whole philosophy is circular. Finn seems to have shown that Hobbes cannot establish his natural philosophy without his prior political commitments, because without those political commitments, philosophical considerations would have pushed him in the opposite direction. But Hobbes' whole project is to derive a political philosophy from natural philosophical (scientific) principles. If Finn is right, then, it would seem Hobbes cannot get to his politics without first establishing his politics. Finn does not seem to recognize this implication of his project, and so he provides no ideas about how to address it or how to interpret Hobbes's natural philosophy in a way that does justice to Hobbes's stated methodological goals. I was left wondering if Finn had done Hobbes any favors after all -- he seems to find an excuse for (or a reasonable explanation of) certain inconsistencies in Hobbes's natural philosophy, but only at the expense of sacrificing the integrity of Hobbes's methodology and his express commitment to providing a scientific, geometry-like demonstration of certain political conclusions from independently-derived first principles.

Overall, Finn's project is an ambitious one in that it attempts to reconcile the two seemingly most disparate parts of Hobbes's philosophy. The questions he seeks to address are undoubtedly significant ones, even though I ultimately found his answers to be somewhat lacking. Nonetheless, this book serves as a good reminder of the fact that Hobbes's natural philosophy does not exist in a vacuum. At the very least, Hobbes wants the reader to be aware of the dangerous ways in which certain metaphysical and epistemological ideas can be misused in the political arena. In this sense, Finn is surely right that Hobbes's natural philosophy has a politics. However, more needs to be done before it is shown that his natural philosophy is a logical consequence of that politics.