Thomas Kuhn

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Nickles, Thomas (ed.), Thomas Kuhn, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 312pp, $21.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521796482

Reviewed by Howard Sankey, University of Melbourne


This volume of essays about Thomas Kuhn contains new work by key figures in the area of Kuhn-studies. The essays treat Kuhn primarily as a philosopher rather than a historian of science. They analyze the background setting of Kuhn’s ideas, and cover such topics as his account of scientific practice, cognitive aspects of scientific reasoning and conceptual change, and Kuhn’s influence on feminist philosophy of science. While the volume is principally conceived as an introduction to Kuhn for the generalist, it contains much that will be of interest to specialists. The essays combine criticism with exposition. But the volume also has a prospective orientation. For it seeks to place Kuhn’s ideas within the frame of ongoing and future developments in the philosophy of science. The volume opens with an Introduction by the Editor, Thomas Nickles, and closes with a select bibliography of English-language literature relating to Kuhn.

Background coverage is provided by the Editor’s Introduction and the first three essays of the volume. In the Introduction, Nickles presents a summary of the account of science presented by Kuhn in The Structure of Scientific Revolutions, as well as an overview of Kuhn’s life and academic career. As Kuhn’s work has had some influence on postmodernist tendencies in Science Studies, Nickles devotes several pages to the question of whether Kuhn’s account is a postmodernist theory of science. In the opening essay of the volume, Michael Friedman notes substantial commonalities between Kuhn’s account of scientific revolutions and Rudolf Carnap’s philosophy of linguistic frameworks. Friedman traces these commonalities back to the common influence of early twentieth century neo-Kantianism, while noting an underlying tension between realist and idealist elements within the neo-Kantian tradition to which Kuhn explicitly acknowledges an intellectual debt. In his contribution, Gary Gutting draws parallels and contrasts between Kuhn and French philosophy of science, but notes that no real influence or interaction took place. By contrast, Kuhn engaged in a more significant exchange with Karl Popper and Imre Lakatos, which forms the subject of John Worrall’s essay. Worrall analyzes the Kuhn-Popper controversy, as well as Lakatos’s attempted synthesis of the two, while emphasizing that a number of Kuhn’s methodological claims may be derived from a Duhemian analysis of the logic of theory-testing.

Philosophical reception of Kuhn has been largely conditioned by the dominant outlook within the philosophy of science. Philosophers have tended to conceive of science in broadly epistemological terms. Thus, they have taken Kuhn’s account of science to be relevant to questions about the nature of scientific knowledge, such as the relation between theory and evidence, and the rationality of scientific theory-choice. A number of commentators, by contrast, have understood Kuhn’s account of science as an account of scientific practice, rather than as an account of scientific knowledge.

In this volume, the essays by Joseph Rouse and Barry Barnes exemplify the practice-orientated interpretation of Kuhn’s account of science. In his essay, Rouse contrasts the standard interpretation of Kuhn’s account as an account of scientific knowledge with his own reading of it as an account of scientific practice. While Rouse allows that the standard interpretation of the account is defensible, he argues that it is better read as an account of science as a practical activity based on analogical extension of exemplars. Barnes, for his part, contrasts the “large” view of Kuhn with the “small” view. The large view emphasizes the overthrow of “entire scientific worldviews”, whereas the “small” view emphasizes “the mundane details of everyday scientific practice” (pp. 123-4). According to Barnes, Kuhn’s work contains the basis of an account of the nature of social order amongst scientists, since “it displays science as the continuing open-ended elaboration of exemplars, and thereby expresses its continual dependence on the sociability of scientists and the mutual deference they accord to each other in their social relations” (p. 132).

Somewhat more than a third of the volume is taken up by essays that deal with Kuhn’s work in relation to cognitive science. In his own essay, Nickles argues that a new model of scientific cognition is suggested by Kuhn’s account of normal science. Rather than methodical application of explicit rules, Kuhn claims that scientists solve puzzles guided by similarity relations that are learned by exposure to scientific exemplars. Such an account of cognition in the absence of rules derives support, Nickles claims, from computational research on case-based and model-based reasoning. The next two papers address Kuhn’s account of conceptual change from the perspective of cognitive science. Nancy Nersessian demonstrates significant overlap between Kuhn’s family-resemblance account of concepts and the prototype model of conceptual representation proposed by cognitive psychologists such as Eleanor Rosch. Nersessian also sets Kuhn’s views of concept-acquisition within the context of cognitive studies of physics education, and goes beyond Kuhn to explore the creation of concepts by means of mental models. In their contribution, Barker, Chen and Andersen further develop the connection between Kuhn’s account of concepts and prototype theory. They provide detailed analysis of the incommensurability of conceptual taxonomies on the basis of Lawrence Barsalou’s dynamic-frame representation of concepts, demonstrating that incommensurability does not preclude rational comparison of such taxonomies.

One of the most controversial themes of The Structure of Scientific Revolutions is Kuhn’s repeated suggestion that, in some sense, the world changes when there is a change of paradigm. This is the topic of Richard Grandy’s contribution. Where some have taken the image of a world-change as the basis for a full-blown metaphysical position, Grandy adopts a more cautious attitude. He emphasizes the ambivalent and tentative tone of Kuhn’s talk of world-change, as well as the incomplete and partially developed character of Kuhn’s philosophical position as presented in Structure. For Grandy, the world-change image need not be understood in ontological terms. Instead, it may be taken to express the complex nature of the relation between observation and theory, as illustrated by the theory-dependence of observation. As Grandy notes, though, the point might be better presented as a psychological one, rather than in the linguistic terms that Kuhn later tended to employ.

In the final paper of the volume, Helen Longino explores Kuhn’s impact on feminist approaches to science and science studies. Kuhn’s critique of empiricist philosophy of science helped clear a space within which feminist critique of gender bias in science could be undertaken. “Kuhn’s ideas of theory-ladenness”, Longino writes, “gave feminist scientists and scholars a language in which to express their perception that even methodologically impeccable science could nevertheless incorporate social bias” (p. 265). But, in the end, excessive emphasis on theory-ladenness only serves to undermine empirically based critique of sexism in science. Hence, Longino argues that theory-ladenness is to be rejected in favor of a “contextual” form of empiricism, according to which variant background assumptions may determine difference in the “evidential relevance” attached to theory-independent empirical data (p. 276). Such an account would be compatible with a broadly Kuhnian view of scientific change, while permitting an empirically based feminist critique of science.

As indicated above, the volume approaches Kuhn from a philosophical rather than historical perspective. One result of this is a lack of historical scrutiny of a number of key empirical claims about the nature of the historical development of science made by Kuhn in The Structure of Scientific Revolutions. Kuhn made a number of distinctive claims about the single-paradigm domination of normal science, the precipitation of crisis by anomaly and revolutionary displacement of paradigms that have not always proven easy to reconcile with the history of science. Yet surely the historically problematic status of Kuhn’s claims about the development of science is an important issue that should be presented to a generalist readership.

A number of alternative interpretative orientations toward Kuhn are represented in the volume. The essays of Barnes and Rouse, for example, focus on Kuhn’s account of scientific practice, while Worrall places Kuhn’s methodological views within the context of Duhem’s account of theory-testing. Friedman relates Kuhn’s ideas to early twentieth century neo-Kantianism, while Nickles, Nersessian and Barker et al explore those ideas in relation to current research in the cognitive sciences. The overall picture that thus rightly emerges is one of Kuhn as an author whose work is subject to multiple interpretations and appropriations. Yet, in spite of this, a number of the interpretative approaches found in the volume do tend to reflect a common perspective on Kuhn. For there is a tendency to focus on the “middle” Kuhn, the Kuhn of about 1970 who emphasized the role of exemplars and similarity relations, to a somewhat greater extent than on the “later” Kuhn, who was more concerned with semantic problems of reference and translation generated by his view of conceptual change. This tendency combines with the emphasis on scientific practice in the papers by Barnes and Rouse to suggest a view of science that downplays the role of methodological factors in choice of theory. A particularly clear example of this is Nickles’ own discussion of non-rule-based cognition in his treatment of Kuhn’s account of reasoning in normal science.

Nickles remarks in his Introduction that the volume has a bias in favor of cognitive-scientific approaches to Kuhn. This bias seems entirely appropriate, given the forward-looking nature of the volume. It has been difficult to discern a positive philosophical research program that stems from Kuhn’s work. While Kuhn’s influence is pervasive, and Kuhn exegesis flourishes, there is no specifically Kuhnian project that is being pursued in contemporary philosophy of science. However, as the articles by Nickles, Nersessian and Barker et al illustrate, a significant exception may well be found amongst cognitive approaches to science, where Kuhnian ideas are proving to be a fertile source of inspiration. (On the lack of a distinctive Kuhnian legacy, see Alexander Bird, ‘Kuhn’s Wrong Turning’, Studies in History and Philosophy of Science 33: 3 (2002), 443-463.)

While there is much that is good in this volume, some may be disappointed by what they do not find. Those who think that the issue of incommensurability is a semantic issue to be dealt with by a causal theory of reference will find little to support their program here. Those who think that positive methodological insight may be gleaned from Kuhn’s views about epistemic values will find this issue mostly bypassed here. Equally, those who think that that the issue of scientific realism may be interestingly joined on the basis of Kuhn’s account of scientific change will find little positive contribution to the realism debate here. In sum, whether deliberately or otherwise, the volume tends to marginalize some important issues and interpretative approaches. This is no basis for reproach, however, since alternative viewpoints are amply represented elsewhere in the Kuhn literature. The interested reader will be soon led to these by the references at the end of the volume.