Thomas Paine and the Idea of Human Rights

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Robert Lamb, Thomas Paine and the Idea of Human Rights, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 217pp., $99.99 (hbk), IBSN 9781107106529.

Reviewed by Michael L. Frazer, University of East Anglia


Robert Lamb's new monograph on Thomas Paine dramatically reverses the methods standardly used by British historians of political thought. Cambridge contextualism involves treating timeless philosophical treatises as contributions to the specific debates going on at the moment of their composition. Those adopting this method are motivated, at least in part, by a deep suspicion of philosophers and their motives. Quentin Skinner quipped that seminar rooms are really battlefields, with arguments as moves in particular ideological struggles. The key to understanding an allegedly philosophical text is not to evaluate the arguments, but to determine the strategy underlying them.

Yet while Cambridge-trained contextualists typically seek to reduce history's greatest political philosophers to the status of mere pamphleteers, Lamb seeks to elevate one of history's most important pamphleteers to the status of a political philosopher. Just as no philosophical treatise can ever entirely escape the concerns of its time, so too is no political tract entirely limited by them. Every act of practical judgment involves the application of general principles to particular situations; each interpreter of others' judgments can feel free to focus on either the principles or the situation, or some combination of the two. Lamb not only makes his choice in the matter clear, but also devotes an entire methodological chapter to defending it.

Although pamphlets like Paine's Common Sense or his later, even more interesting Agrarian Justice were undoubtedly intended as intervention at a particular moment in a particular political debate, Lamb quotes Paine explicitly stating that, in the latter case, "the principle on which it is based is general" (114). What is more, Lamb also quotes Paine as arguing that "Time, with respect to principles, is an eternal NOW: it has no operation upon them: it changes nothing of their nature and qualities" (158). In decoupling Paine's principles from the specific context of the American and French revolutions, Lamb actually lays a better claim than do the contextualists to capturing the intentions of the author being interpreted.

Yet Lamb does share one important feature of Skinnerian contextualism: its characteristically English allergy to what it sees as the all-too-American moralism of liberal political philosophy since Rawls. Lamb is determined to demonstrate Paine's relevance to this sort of liberal theorizing without adopting its "pontificatory and recommendatory tone" (201-202), so loathed both by Cambridge historians and their realist colleagues in the politics department. Lamb insists that "the normative logic and implications of liberal commitments can be unpacked through historical interpretation, without the question of substantive endorsement of the emerging viewpoints ever really arising" (201). As such, he is adamant that he can establish Paine's relevance for today without so much as raising the issue of Paine's correctness.

In his methodology chapter, Lamb's main inspiration for this strangely non-normative form of normative theory is explicitly Jeremy Waldron, who warns us against the "inanity" of seeking the "normative bottom line" of the authors we read, of determining what Hobbes or Locke would prohibit or what Plato or Rousseau would allow (23). Gadamer, acknowledged in a footnote, is a second major influence, with his hermeneutics of dialogue across horizons of time and space. Lamb takes Gadamer's dialogical approach in a Wittgensteinian direction when he suggests that this dialogue can amount to a kind of talking cure for what ails us intellectually and politically. The "real reason why we should turn to consider the political writings of those historical thinkers with whom we have certain overlapping concerns," he argues, is as a form of "therapy" designed "to confront and work through -- though not necessarily resolve -- political problems that we recognize" (23).

The key to successful treatment, however, is to choose the right therapist, just as the only way to have a good conversation is to find someone worth talking to. By the end of Chapter 1, Lamb admits that "The specific value of any one particular instance of historical dialogue . . . is, of course, still to be established" (24). Gadamer and Davidson may be right that successful communication must begin with the charitable assumption that most of what our interlocutor says is both true and valuable, but these assumptions can be disproven over the course of a conversation, as any regular cocktail-party attendee is well aware. To be sure, someone who is wrong about most things may still be worth talking to -- if they are wrong in an entertaining or helpfully provocative way, for example. But the most common and obvious reason to remain in dialogue with others -- especially on matters of political and philosophical importance -- is because they are right much of the time, especially if the specific subjects on which they are correct correspond to lacunae in our own networks of justified true beliefs.

Lamb pursues several paths to establish that reading Paine with him is worth the effort, while nonetheless studiously avoiding anything that could be considered a vindication of Paine's theories as correct in some way. First, by resolving contradictions among arguments scattered across decades worth of pamphlets, he makes the case for Paine's coherence. Second, by drawing constant parallels between the views so reconstructed and those popular among liberal political theorists today, he makes the case for Paine's continuing relevance.

Third is the case for Paine's originality and distinctness. Here, too, Lamb's approach is the diametric opposite of that prevalent in Cambridge, where many a dissertation has been produced establishing that what were once thought to be the insights of a philosophical genius were in fact either plagiarized from a now-obscure hack or the forgotten commonplaces of the discourse of the day. It is also here that Lamb has set himself the greatest challenge, since Paine's ideas are admittedly similar, not only to those of his fellow Enlightenment pamphleteers, but also those familiar from already-canonical early modern liberals. There is no point in turning to Paine for our therapy, after all, if we have already undergone a successful course of treatment under others.

While Lamb struggles to distinguish Paine's semi-cosmopolitan position on national self-determination from Kant's, Paine's recurrent similarity to Locke is especially problematic. Lamb repeatedly insists that although Locke's theories "ostensibly" resemble Paine's, "the apparent similarities can be shown to be superficial in ways that reveal the character of each" (33). Chapter 2 is devoted to distinguishing Paine's theories of natural rights and the consent-based legitimation from those of his illustrious forbearer. The claim that Locke and Paine differ on the moral foundations of politics is based on both a controversial interpretation of Locke and a questionable account of what makes a theory "rights-based" as opposed to "duty-based." The result is that "In spite of its defense of inviolable rights . . . Locke's is ultimately a duty-based natural rights theory" (35, emphasis in original). One wonders, however, whether this might be yet another of academia's many distinctions without a difference, especially since Lamb acknowledges that "Paine is aware that jurisprudential logic dictates that rights and duties are correlative" (67).

The problem recurs repeatedly throughout the book. In his discussion of the natural foundation of property rights, for example, Lamb struggles mightily to distinguish "the ostensibly identical but radically divergent arguments . . . (1) that since labor creates value it generates rights for the individuals who undertake it . . . [and] (2) that labor creates value and therefore generates rights" (129-130). This distinction seems to matter only for inept laborers, who labor hard but fail to create anything, to whom Locke (at least in Lamb's reading) would seem to grant property rights regardless, while Paine would not.

The problem is the same in Lamb's chapter on religion, in which Paine's liberalism is revealed to be "normatively secular but foundationally theological" (6). Lamb insists that what separates Paine from Locke on this matter is the way in which the religious foundation relates to the political theory it grounds. Whereas "Locke's theological beliefs structure his political philosophy" throughout (34), Paine's deism establishes basic axioms about human equality that then go on to underlie an otherwise non-theological political theory. While Locke's distinctly Christian God emerges regularly from the foundation of his theory to issue concrete commandments -- directives pointing us toward procreation, industry, the preservation of life, and so on -- Paine's more distant deity does not. Yet the fundamental question at the heart of debates over Waldron's controversial God, Locke, and Equality -- whether secular liberalism can remain standing once the theological foundations on which it once stood have been removed -- remains unanswered. A determination to avoid "the normative bottom line" on these matters often appears to be a refusal to follow one's arguments to their natural conclusions.

Paine's relevance and originality are easier to establish in the middle of the book. In chapter 3, Lamb argues that Paine modifies Locke's theory in such a way as to establish that only representative democracies can be just and legitimate. This distinguishes Paine both from social-contract theorists like Locke who believe that consent can legitimate a wide variety of regime types and the many democratic theorists who are either outright opposed to representation or see it as a sad concession to the practical difficulties of direct democracy in modern nation-states. Lamb sees Paine as arguing that

since equality of outcome is not possible once a majoritarian principle is adopted for the establishment of laws, what is needed is a robust procedural equality and this can be achieved much more thoroughly through deliberative and representative apparatuses and mechanisms than via a direct form of democracy in which the minority views of individuals are discarded (95).

The highlight of the book then comes with the discussion of economic rights in chapter 4. If he were more historically inclined, Lamb might have developed his suggestion that Agrarian Justice "bridges the concerns of late eighteenth-century republicanism with nineteenth-century socialism" (111). Instead, in line with his presentist approach, Lamb focuses on how Paine "generates a radical egalitarianism from within an otherwise libertarian theory of property by insisting that the value of the natural world that preceded . . . cultivation remains commonly owned in a significant moral sense." The difference from Locke here is a truly important one since it justifies an "egalitarian principle of redistribution through government taxation" and individual "rights to welfare provisions" (5). Far from the forced labor that Nozick believed it to be, taxation and redistribution are here the rightful collective reclamation of the portion of the value of an individual's property that stems from the natural resources that rightly belong to us all. Paine is thus the precursor of today's left-libertarianism, and the literature on this position would surely be enriched by a greater engagement with his work.

In the end, Lamb will probably never succeed in his quest to see Paine added to most undergraduate syllabi in political philosophy. Semesters are short, after all, and our limited time with our students is better spent with Hobbes, Locke, Rousseau and Kant. He will succeed in convincing political philosophers writing on some, but not all, of the topics he discusses to take Paine's contribution more seriously. Yet Lamb's explicit goal is not only Paine's rescue from an ignominious exile in the history department, but also "the retrieval and rehabilitation of a particular way of doing political theory" (201). His contribution to current efforts to rouse the history of political thought in Britain from its dogmatically contextualist doldrums is what ultimately makes this book most valuable.