Thomas Reid and Scepticism: His reliabilist response

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de Bary, Philip, Thomas Reid and Scepticism: His reliabilist response, Routledge, 2002, 224pp, $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 0-415-26339-5.

Reviewed by James Somerville, The University of Hull


Philip de Bary considers how Reid’s first principles of contingent truths feature in his response to skepticism. The “main focus” is said to be “on those aspects of Reid’s philosophy for which some direct contemporary relevance can be claimed” (p. 2). Reid seldom invoked philosophical terms of art and would be pained by “the epistemological stock-in-trade” (p. 74).

Conceding that “the assault on impressions and ideas … receives much the greater share of Reid’s time and effort,” de Bary nevertheless thinks it “structurally subservient” (p. 18) because “not all sceptical arguments stem from the ideal theory — in particular the argument from error” (p. 69). He thus distinguishes “arguments against mental representationalism” (p. 17) from arguments involving first principles, arguing that this “second strand” in Reid’s “anti-scepticism … is motivated by … proper recognition that the first strand on its own is not wholly successful” (p. 18). It scarcely follows that the arguments against the theory of ideas are a partial failure. And while more general arguments for skepticism may be logically prior to skepticism about the senses specifically grounded on the theory of ideas, they are secondary in Reid’s works. As a result, the just two chapters on the theory of ideas — Chapter 6, centered on Reid’s chapter “Reflections on the common Theory of Ideas” and Chapter 7, an admitted “historical digression” (p. 126) on his predecessors’ doctrines — appear out of place in a book largely on what is described as the “’positive’ part” of Reid’s “anti-sceptical project — enshrined in ‘the principles of common sense’” (p. 4).

Chapter 1 contrasts “rhetorical flourish” with “argumentative objection” (p. 8). Reid, it is said in the depressingly familiar tradition of those classified as “Reid’s enemies” (p. 19, n. 3), “quite ignores the way in which Humean scepticism is trumped by Humean naturalism” (p. 10). Yet the first half of a sentence whose second part is cited at the very beginning as committing Reid to the “superficial” (p. 12) objection that skeptics “do not practice what they preach” (p. 7) is later cited (on p. 19, n. 2) among “at least five places” where Reid is said to note “Hume’s admission that instinctive beliefs predominate over sceptical doubts in ordinary life” (p. 11). The significance for Reid of Hume’s candor in embracing inconsistent beliefs is lost on de Bary. The baby of “reasoned arguments” has been thrown out with the bath water of “polemic … against scepticism” (p. 12).

First, let de Bary have his say.

Reid, he says, “starts his reasoned attack on scepticism from a clear-eyed acknowledgement that in its most radical form, scepticism cannot be answered.” Two passages are cited where Reid is said to seem “openly to countenance the possibility that an extreme scepticism might be correct” (p. 16). On the basis of these Reid is said to be “always prepared (or at least should always be prepared) to entertain the possibility of global deception, even at God’s hands” (p. 68). But both passages contain an ‘if’, as is indeed noticed in the case of a third remark on another subject (p. 82). Admittedly, in all three cases the antecedent is not cast in a conditional or subjunctive mood; but only in the last passage would the resulting implication of its falsity be appropriate. The two passages at issue constitute ripostes to the skeptic, where Reid is simply urging that the consequent follows from the antecedent; so an implication of the falsity of the antecedent, which in any case the skeptic would not concede, would not be in place. While it is an open question for the skeptic whether the belief in perception is right, it is not one for Reid himself (cf. pp. 74 and 178), who is merely pointing to what follows granted the truth of the antecedent, which he would not himself grant. Strangely, de Bary also allows that “Reid does not think that we are in fact deceived” (p. 16).

Further misunderstanding is betrayed in another reason given for ascribing fallibilism to Reid. A rhetorical question addressed to Cartesians asking why should consciousness be believed implicitly when they have supposed all other faculties fallacious, a clear ad hominem objection, is glossed as: “Reid says, in effect, that if we insist, with Descartes and his followers, that foundational beliefs be immune to all conceivable doubt, we shall have no foundations” (p. 21) “and the sceptic will have won” (pp. 28-9). The passage is taken as evidence that “Reid’s fallibilism is thorough-going enough to extend even to” consciousness (p. 175). To be fair, “Reid’s claim” is also said to be that “it is arbitrary to trust” any one faculty over others (p. 23).

As de Bary introduces it, Reid’s supposed fallibilism amounts to what Jonathan Bennett characterizes as “one of those epistemological blockbusters which begins, ‘suppose that, as is logically possible, … ‘.” Thus: “in his overarching fallibilism, we can see him conceding enough space for an extreme and irrefutable scepticism to inhabit, even if it is only the space of bare logical possibility” (p. 16). Since an applicable, non-formal criterion for logical possibility has so far escaped philosophers, what initially seems to be neither self-contradictory nor nonsense may yet turn out so on further argument. And as Reid himself holds, conceivability is no test of possibility. The arguments of Cudworth on the unintelligibility of universal doubt, later restated by Price, were evidently known to Hume. Although Reid does not cite Cudworth or Price on this issue, he must have read their accounts; as well as Locke’s jest with the skeptic that “if all be a Dream,” the skeptical questioning is part of this long dream so that it does not matter now what one calls a dream. Had Locke wrote ‘is’ rather than ‘be’ de Bary would take it as a concession; but Locke is not going to allow the skeptic that it is an open question whether all is a dream, because the hypothesis is vacuous. In the two Reid passages the vacuity rather of the consequent is being presumed. To take “Reid’s meaning” as a dismissal of idle supposition is not to add to it. It is to take it as exhibiting “the specifically religious aspect of” his “recoil” (p. 183) from “the possibility that God might deceive us for our own good” (p. 178); this exclusion, de Bary confesses, “would not only be a considerable embarrassment for our interpretation of Reid throughout this study” but would also make it “impossible, on any interpretation, to reconcile with those passages (admittedly few in number) which strongly suggest that Reid regards God’s veracity as a genuinely open question” (ibid.). Yet Reid is later imagined to think the possibility of “paternalistic deception” (ibid.) by God “too remote to disturb me” and to avow “I don’t really mind” (p. 189).

In Chapter 4 a tamer fallibilism features: “The three first principles that expressly vouch for the natural faculties say of those faculties, not that they are infallible … but that they are ‘not fallacious’.” This uninteresting denial of “infallibilism” is conflated with the blockbuster fallibilism: no doubt Reid “would have liked it if his first principles could have been made absolutely demon-proof.” So while rightly urging that “occasional error” is perfectly compatible with “overall reliability” (p. 61), de Bary thinks proof against a deceiving demon, or God, would be available only if a claim to infallibility could be upheld. It is worth noting — though Reid does not seem to have done so — that “the argument from error” is frequently combined with some form of representationalism, as are the arguments for doubting in the First Meditation, whereby an attempt is made to drive a wedge between reality and human perception of it. Hume’s argument for skepticism about reason exceptionally does not depend on the theory of ideas. Reid’s assault on the theory, far from being irrelevant to diabolical or divine deception, has the potential to undermine the blockbuster fallibilism de Bary attributes to him.

What is advertised as “the most crucial interpretative question about Reid’s response to scepticism” (p. 37) is discussed in Chapter 5. Reid is said to make “two claims” about the first principles of common sense: “an ‘Innateness Claim’ and a ‘Truth Claim’” (p. 4). The former, it is said, “describes first principles,” the latter “legitimates them” (p. 46, n. 14). Bits of Reid’s sentences are assigned to one or the other — though it is added, “we need to insist on a sharper distinction than he usually troubles to make between these two claims for first principles” (p. 64). If Reid does not forge some link between the two, it is urged, “the sceptical challenge to their warrant will remain unmet” (p. 65). It is argued that “the blatant attempt to link the Innateness Claim and the Truth Claim for first principles via belief in a non-deceiving God is not one that can be pinned on Reid” (p. 69) and that there is no metaprinciple “among Reid’s principles of common sense” (p. 75). The conclusion is that “Reid’s basic procedure with respect to this link is not really to try to forge it at all, but simply, baldly, daringly, to assume it” (p. 83).

An introduction contains facts about Reid’s life that almost all likely readers will not need to be reminded of, but it is also remarked there that the “view of Reid as a worthy object of study” is a minority one (p. 4). The main conclusion will delight Reid’s detractors. Again, it would be unfair not to record that the force of what may be called the burden of proof argument is often seen: it is for the skeptic to prove first principles doubtful. Indeed, at one place de Bary observes: “Reid’s new way of doing epistemology means that guarantees can be done away with” (p. 68) — which does not prevent much agonizing later over “the role of God in Reid’s philosophy” (p. 165); for Reid is said to appear “to turn to God” “to underpin the Truth Claim” (p. 161). But how is there a truth claim at all? The notion seems not only to conflate justification with truth but in de Bary’s hands to depict Reid as the dogmatist his detractors have always dismissed him as. There is no requirement that Reid say that first principles are true; he simply presumes that they are. It is for the skeptic to prove that he ought not to. More blurring occurs between proof and “positive argumentative support” (p. 130). While Reid denies that first principles are capable of direct proof, he scarcely abandons argument: the burden of proof argument is itself argument.

Attention to specific principles in Chapter 9 would have revealed that it is not memory and testimony “on the whole” (p. 153) that can be confirmed by experience; rather, particular memory claims and pieces of testimony can receive corroboration. By contrast, appeal to “track record arguments” with regard to the inductive principle does involve “epistemic circularity” (p. 156); but then a principle of regularity in nature is not, as Reid supposes, a principle of inference.

Despite what is said on p. 64, Reid never says that first principles are innate. Some explanation might seem to be called for why he rarely uses the term ‘innate’, were if not that Locke’s attack on innate principles and Hume’s scathing criticism of it in turn sufficiently explains Reid’s avoidance of the term. The places were he does employ it — other than where he is referring to the doctrine of others — point to some distinction between intellectual capacities, where such terms as ‘original’, ‘natural’ and ‘instinctive’ are used instead, and other capacities, as when some desires and practical skills are described as innate. Thus, it is not that innate beliefs may not be true beliefs, as de Bary has as an objection (ibid.). Instead, innate, not beliefs, but dispositions — whether to act or to believe — hardly constitute knowledge of truths, even granted the pre-Lockean assumption that knowledge can be sensibly characterized as innate at all (see p. 87, n. 1). A connected point missed too is that principles of belief, which are psychological principles, cannot themselves be beliefs, as Reid’s first principles are also intended to be. So “the most general laws by which we immediately assent to propositions upon understanding them” (p. 36), while psychological laws relating to the various propositions assented to, are distinct from these propositions. This distinction is not at all the same as the distinction between “particular cases … of self-evident beliefs” and the generalized first principles Reid lists (p. 36; cf. pp. 45-6, n. 2).

If, as de Bary states, there is “no dispute with Hume about the Innateness Claim as such” (p. 65), can Reid be rescued from the objection that he has argued fallaciously from the psychological disposition to hold a belief to the correctness of so holding it? It is time to scoop the baby up from the sink. The key argument, as was seen by Sidgwick and stated without reference to Reid by Moore, is that common sense beliefs are held by all, including skeptics. Hence they hold inconsistent beliefs, as Hume candidly acknowledged but Berkeley refused to. Skepticism is literally untenable. Since common sense beliefs are universally held, the only occasion there is to state that they are true is when arguing with skeptics who doubt their truth; but even then it is not required, for the burden of proof rests with the skeptic to prove their doubtfulness.

Everybody thinks that colors, tastes and heat are part of the physical world; only ideal theorists also suppose that they exist in the mind. It is not that Reid “must regard vulgar notions of secondary qualities as strictly wrong” (p. 44). He holds instead that ideal theorists miscall the qualities in bodies of colors, tastes and heat sensations. He defends the vulgar against the charge of confusing these qualities with sensations; though since sensations are rarely attended to, the distinction is made explicit only by philosophers. The caricature given of Reid’s position is supported by the objection by Hume (p. 47, n. 21), which in collapsing any distinction between quality and sensation just presupposes the theory of ideas. Moreover, de Bary moves from Reid’s ‘distinctly perceive’ to his ‘distinct notion’: distinctly hearing or distinctly remembering is not as such having distinct notions. ‘Distinctly’ is rightly said to be a qualification on p. 45, yet is denied by implication to be so on p. 61.

The first comma in the seventh principle occurs in the first edition; though “an oversight on Hamilton’s part” (p. 80) does lead to a false accusation on p. 12 of misquotation. The kettle can accuse the pot of slight misquotation on pp. 37, 53 and 120. Brown is knighted on pp. 91 and 106. Minor errors occur on pp. 62, n. 5, 115 and 141.