Thomas Reid on Logic, Rhetoric and the Fine Arts: Papers on the Culture of the Mind

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Alexander Broadie (ed.), Thomas Reid on Logic, Rhetoric and the Fine Arts: Papers on the Culture of the Mind, Pennsylvania State University Press, 2005, 400pp, $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 0271026782. Also published by Edinburgh University Press, £75.00 (hbk), ISBN 0748616845.

Reviewed by James A. Harris, University of St. Andrews


In this, the fifth volume of the Edinburgh Edition of Thomas Reid, Alexander Broadie has collected Reid's writings on three distinct but related topics: what Reid terms 'the culture of the mind', logic, and rhetoric. Most of these writings exist only in manuscript form. The sole part of the volume under review to have been previously published is the 'Brief Account of Aristotle's Logic. With Remarks' that Reid wrote for Kames's Sketches of the History of Man. The rest of the volume comprises an assortment of Reid's lecture notes for a class he appears to have given annually at Glasgow from 1764 until 1780. The title chosen for the volume is in fact slightly misleading, for the only 'fine art' treated in any detail is rhetoric, or 'eloquence'. Such discussion as there is of music, painting, sculpture, drama and poetry is extremely compressed. This is not surprising, since teaching the arts of taste was not Reid's concern in this class. The task he set himself, rather, was to prepare young men for active lives in the professions -- particularly law and the Church. The manuscripts brought together by Broadie allow a fascinating insight into Reid's ambitions as a cultivator of the practical skills he regarded as necessary to a successful and useful life in eighteenth-century Britain. Reid's principal published works -- the Inquiry into the Human Mind (1764), the Essays on the Intellectual Powers (1785), and the Essays on the Active Powers (1788) -- are, for the most part, exercises in a purely analytical, or 'anatomical', approach to the human mind. They represent, however, only a part of Reid's teaching programme. In this review I shall give a sketch of how the manuscripts on the culture of the mind, logic and rhetoric broaden our picture of Reid as educator.

Reid taught two daily classes at Glasgow. One was a lower 'public' class, at 7:30 in the morning. The subjects for this class were 'pneumatology' (study of the powers of the mind), ethics, and politics. The two published volumes of Essays are polished versions of the lectures Reid gave on pneumatological subjects. Knud Haakonssen's edition of Reid's lectures on the duties and rights of 'practical ethics' gives us an idea of the rest of the course. (Haakonssen's edition, originally published by Princeton University Press in 1990, will be reissued in revised form as the seventh volume of the Edinburgh Reid; it will be supplemented by a wholly new volume given over to Reid's writings on society and politics.) The second class Reid taught was a higher 'private' class, at 12 noon. According to its editor, the volume under review presents what we know of what Reid taught in this class. Hutcheson had devoted the private class to the ancient moralists, and Smith had lectured on rhetoric and belles lettres. Reid seems to have wanted to use the class as a means of bridging the divide between the science of the mind taught earlier in the morning and the life that awaited the young men of the student body once they graduated. 'I hope you all come here with a serious intention to improve in usefull knowledge, and to acquire those Qualifications that may fit you to pass through Life with honour to yourselves and to your Relations and with advantage to your Country & to Mankind': thus Reid opened the course (p. 5). The inquiry into the powers of the mind carried out in the public class was to stand as the foundation for further investigations into the possibility of the cultivation and improvement of those powers. In no sense was accurate knowledge of the workings of the mind an end in itself.

Reid's design in the first part of the private class was to establish, first, that the mind is capable of being improved 'by proper Culture', and, secondly, to consider what improvement each of the several faculties of the mind is capable of receiving. He discussed the possibilities for improvement of the faculties provided by nature, by social life, and by formal education. While we are by nature endowed with various principles by which we are fitted to receive improvement -- the power of acquiring habits, natural curiosity, the natural belief that past experience is a reliable guide to what will happen in the future -- nature on its own, Reid was keen to emphasise, cannot be relied upon to ensure that we improve beyond the state of the beasts. Social life is essential to the culture of the mind, not least because it is only in society that language is possible, and with it the development of rationality. In a solitary state, moreover, there can be no religion or exercise of the moral powers, and no enjoyment but the gratification of appetite. In this connection, Reid addressed Rousseau's second Discourse and the 'paradox' contained in the idea that the 'unsocial State' might be the 'natural' and 'most perfect and … most happy' state for human beings (pp. 42-45; 72-75). Like almost all of his fellow Scots, Reid found Rousseau's position incredible. 'Whatever Eloquence and Acuteness the Author has displayed in treating this Subject; it is difficult to think that it was not meant merely as a play of Imagination' (p. 43). The larger theme of the lectures in this part of the course was that, while we are fashioned by God for improvement, it is up to us to ensure that we become what we can be. Piety should not be allowed to develop into the belief that we have no responsibility for what we make of our lives.

Logic is, according to Reid, simply 'justness and accuracy of thought' (p. 145). Reid acknowledges in the 'Brief Account' that one may learn to reason justly and accurately without being taught the rules of logic. 'But practice, joined with rules, may carry a man on his art farther and more quickly, than practice without rules' (p. 143). Also of use are examples of common fallacies, and instruction as to how to avoid them. Reid was particularly concerned to develop the skills of inductive reasoning in his students, for 'The greatest part of human knowledge rests upon evidence of this kind' (p. 146). From the importance of induction followed the irrelevance of the 'stately fabrick' of Aristotle's theory of syllogistic reasoning. There is no way of forcing probabilistic reasoning into syllogistic form. Nor, for that matter, is there a syllogistic interpretation of a simple inference of the form 'A is greater than B; B is greater than C; therefore A is greater than C': a significant part of mathematics also is inapt for syllogistic treatment. At the end of the 'Brief Account', however, it is made apparent that Reid's attitude towards Aristotle was more complicated than is suggested by his outright rejection of the syllogism 'considered as an engine of science'. Aristotle saw what many moderns, under the influence of Descartes, have missed: that there is a real and important distinction to be drawn between self-evident propositions, and propositions deduced by just reasoning from self-evident propositions. Ancient philosophy, it is true, admits too many propositions as self-evident; but 'Since the time of Descartes, it has been fashionable with those who dealt in abstract philosophy, to employ their invention in finding philosophical arguments, either to prove those truths which ought to be received as first principles, or to overturn them' (p. 149).

An important part of justness and accuracy of thought as Reid understood it is thus the distinguishing of self-evident propositions from those that admit of proof. This was a theme of many of his lectures on logic. For Reid, the two modern masters in the improvement of our reasoning powers were Bacon and Locke. Reid's admiration for Bacon is obvious and well known, but his respect for Locke is easy to miss, obscured by the vehemence of his rejection of the way of ideas. The state of logic is 'much altered since Locke wrote', Reid says in the 'Brief Account'; 'Logic has been much improved, chiefly by his writings' (p. 141). Locke's great achievement, in Reid's eyes, was to have shown the importance for the clarification of our notions of an account of the origins of those notions. 'It was a very noble attempt of Mr Lock to trace the various complex Notions with which the mind is stored to those simple materials of which they are compounded and to shew how we at first acquire these simple Notions' (p. 164). Locke himself was misled by his antipathy to innateness and tried to derive all our ideas from sensation and reflection, but a more judicious development of Locke's project would show that, while many notions are acquired by experience, education, instruction and reasoning, there remain others which are, as Reid put it, 'the work of Nature'. These notions are the work of nature in so far as there is a set of 'natural and original judgments' that deploy them. 'To enumerate the various kinds of natural and original Judgments we form & to reduce them to certain Classes, is a great Desideratum in Logic hitherto Unattempted' (p. 165). Such a logic would, despite its anti-empiricism, still be a Lockean logic.

Eloquence, according to Reid, is undoubtedly the noblest of the fine arts, and indeed the most remarkable of all powers, 'because it commands the passions the affections the Judgements the purposes and Resolutions of other Men' (p. 197). Reid rejected the definitions given of eloquence by both Aristotle and Cicero. It is not, simply, the art of persuasion, since sometimes the orator intends not to persuade but to please or move; nor is it ars apte et ornate loquendi, for there are many occasions when ornamented speech would be inappropriate. 'We may define Eloquence to be the Art of Speaking so as to answer the purpose intended by it' (p. 204). The purpose may be to inform or explain, to convince the judgment, to please the fancy, to move the passions, or to bend the will and persuade to action. Reid told his students that a mastery of eloquence was of particular importance in the aftermath of the establishment in Britain of civil and ecclesiastical liberty at the end of the previous century. 'All Men are become sensible of the Power of Speech' (p. 203). Purity, propriety and elegance in speech had notably improved since 1688, and would doubtless continue to improve in the future. It mattered, therefore, that students learned to speak the English of the day, rather than an English that would sound absurd because out of date. Nowhere is Reid's interest in the practical application of the science of the mind more evident than in his lectures on eloquence, for, as he saw it, nothing matters more than a mastery of language. 'In the Pulpit and at the Bar the figure a Man makes depends upon his Powers of Speaking. But besides these particular Professions which must be confined to a few, every Gentleman who chuses to take any concern in publick affairs whether of Church or State, may have access to employ his Talent in Speaking in Ecclesiastical Courts from the lowest to the highest. In Affairs of civil Government & police from a Quarter Sessions to the british Parliament' (p. 201).

Reid told the students of his private class that he intended 'to treat first of the Culture of the human Mind. Secondly of the Connection between Mind and Body and their mutual Influence on one another, which will make way for some observations on the fine Arts and Chiefly on Eloquence with which we shall conclude' (p. 10). There is not much said about the connection between mind and body in this collection of Reid's manuscripts. It would be interesting to know whether this is because the texts of the relevant lectures do not exist, or because the editor chose not to include them. There is some repetition in the texts that are included, and often they become fragmentary and condensed to the point of crypticness. This can hardly be regarded as the editor's fault, however. Alexander Broadie has done an excellent job with very difficult material. He provides an illuminating introduction, and helpful notes. It is probably true to say that Reid's lecture notes on the culture of the mind, logic, and eloquence will be of interest only to the reader already familiar with Reid's published writings; but such a reader will come away from this book with an improved understanding of what Reid sought to achieve as a teacher of moral philosophy.