Thomas Reid on Practical Ethics: Lectures and Papers on Natural Religion, Self-Government, Natural Jurisprudence and the Law of Nations

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Thomas Reid, Thomas Reid on Practical Ethics: Lectures and Papers on Natural Religion, Self-Government, Natural Jurisprudence and the Law of Nations, Knud Haakonssen (ed.), Penn State University Press, 2007, 404pp., $124.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780271032290.

Reviewed by Alexander Broadie, University of Glasgow


Since the end of the eighteenth century Thomas Reid has been known for three books, An Inquiry into the Human Mind, Essays on the Intellectual Powers and Essays on the Active Powers, and for almost nothing else that he wrote. All three are masterworks and more than any other writings by anyone, they constitute what came to be identified as the 'Scottish school of common sense philosophy', a school that had an immense impact on philosophers elsewhere in Europe, and also in North America where it was one of the dominant philosophies, perhaps the one with the most adherents. Yet Reid wrote a great deal more than those three books and the 'more' covers a great deal that is not touched on, or is barely touched on, in his published works. This means that our picture of Reid's intellectual achievement is seriously inadequate. Edinburgh University Press is now setting the record straight by publishing the 'Edinburgh Edition of Thomas Reid', a projected ten-volume series under the general editorship of Knud Haakonssen. The book under review, a revised edition of a volume which appeared under the Princeton University Press imprint in 1990 and which for some years now has been out of print, is volume six in the Edinburgh series. What has appeared so far in the series has already transformed our understanding of what Reid was about, and further enlightenment will come with the remaining volumes. Reid's ideas on practical ethics receive very little attention, hardly any at all, in his three masterworks. There is very brief discussion on the subject in the Essays on the Active Powers and that is just about it. The very substantial book under review gives clear witness to how much more there was to Reid than had once been thought.

Following a seventy-eight page Introduction by Knud Haakonssen there are a hundred and seventy five pages containing seventeen of Reid's lectures and papers on practical ethics. This is followed by a hundred and thirty five pages of commentary and textual notes. There is also a bibliography. One of the papers ('Some thoughts on the utopian system') included in the Princeton edition has been omitted from this edition and is destined to appear in the Edinburgh Edition's volume eight (Thomas Reid on Society and Politics, edited by Knud Haakonssen and Paul Wood, expected in 2009). The Princeton 'Introduction' has also been revised as have the Commentary and the textual notes, and the extensive bibliography is fully up to date. This is then a new edition for the Edinburgh series and is essential reading for anyone wishing to come to grips with Reid's practical philosophy.

What, then, do we learn that disturbs the two-centuries-old stereotype of Reid? At the heart of the stereotype is the concept of Reid as primarily a negative philosopher reacting to Humean scepticism by pointing out the incoherence of that form of scepticism, and doing it on the basis of a set of 'common sense principles' that are, along with the destruction of Hume's system, his major contribution to philosophy, a contribution that allows him to be presented as marking a brand-new beginning in philosophy. On this view Reid is first and foremost, and indeed almost solely, an epistemologist demolishing one theoretical philosophy and replacing it with another. The volume under review shows this picture to be badly skewed for Reid is here seen to have a deep and wide-ranging practical philosophy, that is by no means restricted to theoretical questions in epistemology and that is by no means simply directed to countering scepticism regarding morality or anything else. For far from being the kind of ivory-towered philosopher Dugald Stewart presents Reid as being, he was in fact very much interested in the practical problems of people and of states and was concerned to point out practical means to resolving the problems.

The papers in this volume deal with practical ethics in general and with natural jurisprudence, or justice, in particular, and they have been arranged by Haakonssen in a manner that would have been instantly recognisable to an eighteenth-century jurisprudentialist. The standard division of duties into those we have to God, to ourselves and to others is taken by Haakonssen as a principle of organisation of the material, with duties to others being dealt with in a series of papers covering individuals in private jurisprudence, individuals in economic jurisprudence and then individuals in political jurisprudence, as the circle is systematically widened to cover first the individual in isolation from organised society (and therefore as if in a state of nature), then the individual in her/his household (and therefore in relation to her/his spouse, to a parent, to a child or to a servant) and finally the individual in relation to the state.

The range of legal knowledge that Reid brings to bear is impressive. It has to be recalled that Reid never practised as a lawyer nor received legal training nor held the kind of office which would have permitted him to accumulate a store of legal knowledge and insight on the hoof. What then are his sources and when did he come by them? Haakonssen demonstrates that Reid was hardly at all concerned with natural jurisprudence during his years as a regent at King's College, Aberdeen (1751-1764), though he was taught the rudiments of it while a student under George Turnbull at Marischal College, Aberdeen. The breakthrough came after he arrived in Glasgow in 1764 to take up the Chair of Moral Philosophy. He studied the practical philosophy of Hutcheson, a predecessor in the Chair, who himself had made a close study of Gershom Carmichael, one of the great authorities on Pufendorf's natural jurisprudence. It is plain that Reid studied Grotius, Pufendorf, Locke, Vattel and Selden and many others. Reid's immediate predecessor, Adam Smith, had likewise acquainted himself with the great European tradition of natural jurisprudence, and in large measure the moral philosophy of the Scottish Enlightenment is a continuation of that tradition.

Reid must have been immersed in all this material for a long time and while his knowledge is primarily bookish, it may reasonably be supposed that, as Haakonssen surmises, Reid would have discussed at least some matters with legal acquaintances such as his life-long friend Henry Home, Lord Kames, Reid's likely source of information on, for example, the subject of entails. His discussion of entails is of interest because it reveals Reid's sympathies on an important matter and reveals also his willingness, indeed eagerness, to participate in a debate that had eminently practical implications in Enlightenment Scotland. He plainly wanted things changed on a matter of law and was prepared to speak out on the matter. An entail is the settlement of an estate on a series of heirs so that the immediate possessor has no right to the disposal or alienation of the estate. Reid argues against the law of entails partly because nature has given no-one such a measure of understanding that he can foresee how his estate ought to be disposed of to the end of the world; partly also because entails discourage trade (this because they lessen credit and tend to lead to prosperous traders leaving the country if they can find no land to purchase there); and partly because they discourage the improvement of estates.

Throughout the papers Reid displays knowledge not only of highly abstract legal principles, but also of quite concrete legal issues. Many concrete examples, aside from entails, might be mentioned such as relations between spouses, between parents and children and between a master and his servant. Reid also discusses the claims that a state has on its citizens and that a citizen has on the state, while stressing that at all times the government is constrained by natural law. This natural legal constraint has great practical implications for the citizen's right of resistance and these implications are investigated by Reid who deploys a common distinction between active and passive obedience. His conclusion is that our active obedience is due whenever the government's demands are lawful but that even in the case where its demands are unlawful, that is, where our rights are violated, our obedience may still be due. For the public good has to be consulted. Sometimes the outcome of resistance to unlawful government demands is bound to be so catastrophic that it is better to live with government illegality than seek to resist it. As Reid puts the point: 'The great mischief arising from violent changes of government show that they ought not to be attempted without urgent necessity.' On this matter Reid's thinking accorded with the prevalent view among the natural lawyers of his day.

Countless other practical questions, for example, concerning the right to declare war and the constraints on the conduct of war, are also discussed in the pages of this volume. The papers presented here show Reid to have had a strong sense of civic responsibility, a teacher concerned to educate the moral and civic intuitions of his students (many of whom would go on to be civic leaders), and concerned also to place his practical philosophy within a broad, firm philosophical framework. Haakonssen has executed brilliantly the task of editing these papers, of introducing them and providing judicious commentary.