Thomist Realism and the Linguistic Turn: Toward a More Perfect Form of Existence

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O'Callaghan, John, Thomist Realism and the Linguistic Turn: Toward a More Perfect Form of Existence, University of Notre Dame Press, 2003, 392pp, $59.95 (hbk), ISBN 0268042179.

Reviewed by Susan Brower-Toland, Saint Louis University


There is a well-known tradition in the philosophy of mind and language that attempts to explain the representational properties of expressions in natural language as derivative from the representational properties of the mental states of their users. According to this tradition, words represent by being conventionally associated with concepts or mental representations. This picture of mind and language, often dubbed “mental representationalism”, has a long and distinguished history, going back at least to Aristotle’s famous discussion in De Interpretatione and continuing even to the present. This traditional picture has increasingly come under attack, especially from philosophers influenced by the Linguistic Turn, a movement whose general methodological position reverses the priority of thought over language. Such philosophers reject the traditional “Aristotelian” account of linguistic meaning and mental representation, placing language itself at the very foundation of traditional problems of philosophy.

It is against this background that Thomist Realism and the Linguistic Turn must be understood. In this book John O’Callaghan presents and develops Thomas Aquinas’s account of mind and language with the specific aim of distancing one of Aristotle’s greatest followers from the so-called Aristotelian tradition of mind and language, and thereby showing that at least the Thomistic-Aristotelian tradition may be brought into fruitful dialogue with contemporary discussions influenced by the Linguistic Turn. As O’Callaghan himself describes his project, it has both a positive and a negative aim, namely, to “make some progress toward a better understanding of what the Thomistic-Aristotelian tradition does and does not claim about the relations that hold among words, thoughts, and things” (3). O’Callaghan’s discussion is rich and, in many ways, compelling. As we shall see, however, it succeeds more in accomplishing its negative aim (that of showing what Aquinas does not hold) than it does in accomplishing its positive aim (that of making clear what Aquinas’s positive views are).

The book can be divided into four parts. In the first part (chaps. 1-2), O’Callaghan considers Aquinas’s treatment of the famous De Interpretatione passage (16a3-8) in which Aristotle sets out his “semantic triangle.” In this passage Aristotle claims that words signify thoughts, which in turn are likenesses of things. This passage is traditionally interpreted as providing the genesis of a semantic theory according to which words signify concepts primarily and things only secondarily (i.e., only through the mediation of such concepts).

O’Callaghan argues convincingly that Aquinas does not interpret Aristotle’s semantic triangle as identifying the significata of natural language expressions with concepts. On the contrary, Aquinas simply takes for granted (and assumes that Aristotle does as well) that words primarily signify extra-mental things. According to Aquinas, the only reason Aristotle mentions concepts in the De Interpretatione passage is to explain how universal expressions can signify things. Since, according to Aquinas, there are no universal things to be the significata for such expressions, their generality has to be accounted for in some other way. It is for this purpose, he says, that Aristotle introduces concepts as the “modus significandi” of universal words—the manner in which they signify particulars. Thus, according to O’Callaghan, “were it not for the manner in which general words signify, intellect [and its concepts] would not play a part in the analysis of signification” (22).

On the basis of all this, O’Callaghan concludes that “St. Thomas is not subject to the charge [of mental representationalism] at the level of his textual interpretation of Aristotle” (77). However, as he immediately goes on to point out, “simply showing that St. Thomas is not subject to the charge at the level of his textual interpretation of Aristotle does not bring an end to the matter since his substantive philosophical discussion might still fall prey to it” (77). In the remainder of the book, therefore, O’Callaghan goes on to argue that even in his more “substantive philosophical discussions” of mind, what is on offer in Aquinas is not any form of representationalism.

As a way of setting the dialectical stage for his argument, O’Callaghan provides, in the second part of the book (chs. 3-5) an overview of early modern and contemporary representationalist theories of mind together with a survey of the some of the most important criticisms lodged against such theories (especially by Hilary Putnam). This part includes: a brief survey of empiricist views about mind and language (specifically as found in Locke, Berkeley, and Hume), as well as early criticisms of these views by thinkers such as Reid, Husserl, Frege, and Wittgenstein (chap. 3); an outline of Jerry Fodor’s attempt to revive the empiricist tradition via his account of mental representation and the Language of Thought (chap. 4); and a overview of Putnam’s characterization and criticism of this broadly “Aristotelian” tradition (chap. 5).

O’Callaghan uses the discussion in the second part of his book to draw out three “philosophical assumptions” or “substantive theses” that he thinks lie at the heart of representationalism and the criticisms of it. He then argues in the third part of the book (chaps. 6-8) that Aquinas rejects each of these theses and hence escapes not only the criticisms that are associated with them, but also “the charge of representationalism” itself. The three theses and O’Callaghan’s reason for thinking Aquinas rejects them may be briefly summarized as follows:

Thesis I: “there are things or objects in the mind that may be akin to pictures, appearances, effects, or some other mode of representation of things outside the mind” (155). O’Callaghan calls this the “Third Thing Thesis” and argues (in chap. 6) that Aquinas rejects it on the grounds that for Aquinas “a concept is [nothing but] the informed activity of the intellect as it grasps res extra animam” (168). Thus, just as in grasping a pen in order to write “there is no third thing that exists between my hand and pen … [s]imilarly, there is no third thing other than the conceiving intellect and the res extra animam” (169-170).
Thesis II: “the mind in its activity of thinking directs itself to these internal objects as what it primarily knows or attends to, or is related to” (156). O’Callaghan labels this the “Introspectibility Thesis” and argues (in chap. 7) that Aquinas explicitly rejects something similar to it. What O’Callaghan has in mind is Aquinas’ contention that intelligible species are not what the intellect understands, but that by which it understands. Moreover, since that by which the intellect understands is not (except in cases of introspection) itself an object of cognition, it is not an object of consciousness.
Thesis III: “there is no intrinsic or necessary relation between the so-called ’mental representations’ in the mind and the represented things outside it” (156). O’Callaghan calls this last thesis the “Internalist Thesis”. He attempts to show (in chap. 8) that Aquinas rejects it, arguing that since Aquinas holds (1) that in cognizing the intellect becomes formally (or structurally) identical to the things cognized and (2) that “the structure the intellect takesÂ…is a result of the particular way in which the human person interacts causally with its environment,” (249) he must be conceived as an externalist about mental content.

In the fourth and final part of the book (chap. 9), O’Callaghan briefly discusses what Aquinas’s views have to contribute to contemporary discussions influenced by linguistically-turned philosophers such as Putnam and McDowell. According to O’Callaghan, what Aquinas offers us is an account of language not typically recognized by philosophers such as Putnam—namely, an account that connects meaning with the mind, but not with mental representations or mental “symbols”. Aquinas’s theory doesn’t render language and knowledge internal, private, or “overly-individualistic”, but is rather more like McDowell’s in its attempt to “eliminate the dualism of the internal and external in our philosophical reflection upon knowledge” (279). Indeed, according to O’Callaghan, Aquinas is more successful at this than is McDowell, since for Aquinas, language and knowledge do not constitute a sui-generis form of life “untethered from the characteristically animal modes of human life, or at best with nothing more than a ’foothold’ in them” (285). On the Thomistic picture these aspects of human nature are really just “a more perfect form of natural existence” (297). It is this picture of the continuity of language and knowledge with more basic forms of human life that O’Callaghan sees as the most significant contribution emerging from the Thomistic-Aristotelian tradition.

O’Callaghan’s book is well worth reading. His project is both ambitious and interesting and the way in which he develops it highlights that, while Aquinas may be one of the more well-studied figures among medieval philosophers, we still have much to learn from (and about) his work. O’Callaghan situates Aquinas’ theory of mind and language vis-à-vis contemporary dialectical debates in a way that is useful and, in doing so, succeeds in showing that Aquinas’s discussion of mind and language is more sophisticated, and has more in common with contemporary discussions than one might expect. When it comes to the explaining of the details of Aquinas’ theory of mind and language, however, I think it must be said that O’Callaghan’s discussion is much less satisfying. This fact, I shall suggest, may owe partly to the overall dialectical strategy that O’Callaghan pursues, and partly to the audience for whom he’s writing.

As should be clear from the foregoing overview, O’Callaghan’s project has a largely negative aim. Although he does make an effort to characterize Aquinas’s positive views about mind and language, as well as to indicate their potential for advancing certain contemporary debates, his main goal is to establish what views Aquinas does not hold. Thus, he devotes the lion’s share of the book to showing that Aquinas is not committed to three theses associated with mental representationalism, and therefore that, ultimately, Aquinas’ account does not fit within the Aristotelian—or mental representationalist—tradition.

With regard to Aquinas’s rejection of the first two representationalist theses, O’Callaghan’s arguments are, for the most part, compelling. The case he makes for Aquinas’s rejection of the “Internalist Thesis” is, however, less convincing. Recall that O’Callaghan’s case rests on attributing to Aquinas two claims: (1) concepts and things conceived by them are formally identical and (2) what concepts we possess depends on our causal interactions with the world. But it’s not clear that Aquinas’s commitment to these two claims is, by itself, sufficient to establish his rejection of the “Internalist Thesis”. Although the formal identity of concepts and their objects establishes, in some sense, an “intrinsic” or “necessary” relation between them, this isn’t, as O’Callaghan acknowledges, sufficient to show that Aquinas rejects internalism. But adding the second claim doesn’t seem to help. For even if (2) is true, all that follows is that concepts are causally dependent on their objects, not logically or metaphysically dependent. But the strong claim is what must be shown to establish that Aquinas is an externalist about mental content.

Even setting aside any worries about Aquinas’s relation to the three theses, important questions still remain. For, even if O’Callaghan is right and Aquinas is not committed to any of these theses, it doesn’t obviously follow that Aquinas isn’t, nevertheless, committed to some version of mental representationalism. In order to establish that Aquinas doesn’t hold any form of mental representationalism, much more is required—in particular, a more careful and a more detailed analysis of Aquinas’s positive views about mind and language. To the extent that one approaches this book expecting this kind of detailed positive analysis, one can’t help but be a bit disappointed.

There are at least two reasons for this. First, O’Callaghan does very little to clarify crucial (and often technical) notions in Aquinas’ theory of mind. In the case of some technical notions, such as, for example, agent and possible intellect, he leaves them entirely unexplained, whereas in the case of others, e.g., abstraction, concepts, and formal identity, his discussion is either vague or merely suggestive. Second, to the extent that he does attempt to clarify these notions, the strategy he pursues is largely negative. For example, when O’Callaghan takes up Aquinas’ notion of abstraction, he begins with the following vague but suggestive description: abstraction is “a progress from a general and confused act based on sense experience to a more specific and precise act” (222) and, thus, ultimately a kind of “developmental view of concept use” (252). Then, all he offers us by way of clarification is an account of how not to understand this abstraction process: it’s not a process of “moving forms from place to place”, of “illumination” or of “selectively attending” or of “selectively ignoring”. The case is much the same when it comes to O’Callaghan’s analysis of concepts. For Aquinas, he says, concepts are “the informed activity of the intellect as it grasps the res extra animam” (168). But isn’t this characterization compatible with a number of more substantive views about the nature of concepts? While O’Callaghan states at various points what he thinks the substantive account is not (e.g. concepts thus construed are not “an inner language”, not “representations” or mental “symbols” nor are they “capacities to use linguistic signs”) he says little more about what it is. O’Callaghan’s tendency to rely on a kind of via negativa approach or to leave certain technical notions altogether unexplained is unfortunate. For it not only undermines, at crucial points, his attempt to communicate in an informative way what Aquinas’s theory of mind actually is; it also makes the volume as a whole less useful than it otherwise might have been.

To be fair, it must be said that what I am describing as shortcomings may be a function of the audience for whom O’Callaghan intends the book. There are several indications that this text is intended, not as introduction to Aquinas for contemporary philosophers of language and mind, but rather as an introduction for Thomists (or people already familiar with Aquinas) to those aspects of discussions in contemporary philosophy of mind relevant for situating Aquinas’s views with respect to them. There is, for example, the fact that O’Callaghan spends three chapters introducing and explaining basic developments in early modern and contemporary discussions in philosophy of mind and language, while often passing over important (and, for most, very foreign) aspects of Aquinas’s metaphysics, psychology, and semantics. All of this makes sense if O’Callaghan is assuming an audience well acquainted with Aquinas but less familiar with contemporary philosophy. For such an audience a full presentation of the details of Aquinas’ view may not be necessary; for such an audience it may be enough simply to rule out various alternative readings in order for O’Callaghan to locate his own interpretation.

Insofar as no text can be suited for every audience, O’Callaghan’s approach is, of course, perfectly acceptable. Nonetheless, I suspect that those still struggling to understand Aquinas’s thought will be disappointed that O’Callaghan hasn’t done more to open it up for us—especially since, given his conversancy with the contemporary literature, he is in such a good position to do so. Even so, this book will be useful for anyone wanting either an introduction to some important issues in contemporary philosophy of mind and language (e.g. the summary of Fodor’s views in chap. 4 is quite good) or some broad direction in thinking about how Aquinas’s thought relates to them.1


1. I’m grateful to Jeff Brower for helpful comments and feedback on an earlier draft of this review.