Thoreau's Importance for Philosophy

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Rick Anthony Furtak, Jonathan Ellsworth, and James D. Reid (eds.), Thoreau's Importance for Philosophy, Fordham University Press, 2012, 314pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780823239306.

Reviewed by Gerald Bruns, University of Notre Dame


The aim of this volume of essays is to revisit questions that the philosopher Stanley Cavell raised some forty years ago in The Senses of Walden (1972), a book in which Cavell attempted (neither for the first time nor the last) to free himself from the conventions of academic philosophy, particularly its insistence upon logical argument and systematic construction, as well as its contentions as to what constitutes a matter of philosophical importance. Three issues seem to have regulated Cavell's reading of Thoreau: (1) How do we stand with respect to the world (and to others in it), particularly if one has turned away from epistemological lines of thinking that come down to us from Descartes and Kant? (2) How do we stand with respect to ourselves, particularly if one cannot recognize oneself in the figure of a disengaged punctual ego exercising rational control, or even as a bemused spectator of the passing show? (3) How should philosophy be written, particularly if the propositional style of philosophical reasoning seems reductive with respect to questions 1 and 2 (not to mention one's own love of the material complexities of language)?

One might describe The Senses of Walden as fieldwork that Cavell conducted while struggling to complete his more theoretical masterpiece, The Claim of Reason (1979). Thoreau's account of his life in the woods provides something like an anthropological foundation for one of Cavell's principal deductions from his reading of J. L. Austin, Wittgenstein, and Heidegger -- what he famously calls the "moral of skepticism, namely that the human creature's basis in the world, its relation to the world as such, is not that of knowing, anyway not what we think of as knowing."[1] What is worth remarking is the way Cavell (following Wittgenstein) estimates "the cost of our continuing temptation to knowledge," namely "the loss, or forgoing, of identity or selfhood" (CR241-2), which is precisely what Thoreau, on Cavell's reading, works to avoid by relocating himself in purely natural surroundings, becoming a neighbor to birds and trees, and even to himself, pursuing a self-possession (or, better, a freedom) that an account of himself and his experiment helps to achieve. Cavell stops short of calling Thoreau's life in the woods a project of self-formation, but that is what it comes down to, especially if we read Walden (as some of the contributors to this volume do) from the later perspective of Cavell's Conditions Handsome and Unhandsome: The Constitution of Emersonian Perfectionism, with its idea that there is no such thing as a "true self" that one must try to find, but only a "next self" that one pursues out of a critical dissatisfaction with one's present self that can never be fully assuaged.[2] As Cavell puts it, "What is in Thoreauvian nextness to us is part of this world, a way of being in it, a curb of it we forever chafe against" (CH9). The desire to reinvent oneself always runs up against the fact of human finitude.

What principally draws Cavell to Walden, however, is the way it is written -- its "puns and paradoxes, its fracturing of idiom and twisting of quotation, its drones of fact and flights of impersonation" (SW16). Likewise with respect to Wittgenstein: "Why does he write this way? " (MWM70); and Emerson (or the later Heidegger), whose "wild variation and excesses of linguistic form have always interfered with rationality" (CH38). Whatever his importance for philosophy, Thoreau's importance for Cavell has as much to do with the play of his language as with the themes of inhabitation and self-creation, as if what Cavell derived from Walden (as from the later Wittgenstein and from Emerson's essays) was a license to write as he will, with his self-confessed "craving for parentheses" (MWx). As Cavell says in one of his Beckman lectures (1983):

A book of philosophy suitable to what Thoreau envisions . . . would be written with next to no forward motion, one that culminates in each sentence. This sounds like a prescription for a new music, say a new discourse, and hence like a negation of poetry as well as of narrative, since it implicitly denies, in a work of literary originality, the role of the line; the sentence is everything. Naturally I hope it also sounds like a description of Walden.[3]

In roughly this spirit the editors of the volume under review propose that "Whatever category of writing Walden falls into . . . it can hardly be designated as a genre in which philosophical works cannot be written" (9), and accordingly they have assembled a group of essays that try to take Thoreau seriously as a philosopher, come what may. Thus in "Thoreau and Emersonian Perfectionism," Stanley Bates follows Cavell in figuring Walden as "an epic of self-cultivation" (28) -- a work of moral philosophy whose argument is that (pace Descartes) one cannot secure one's existence, much less one's identity, simply by thinking; one must take responsibility for oneself by remaking oneself (from the ground up), which means making oneself intelligible to oneself (and to others). Whence Jonathan Ellsworth, in "How Walden Works: Thoreau and the Socratic Art of Provocation," takes the question -- or, more exactly, self-questioning and self-accounting -- to be Thoreau's Socratic method of practicing philosophy: "For Socrates and Thoreau, apologia is at the heart of philosophy. The ability to account for our actions is an essential component of philosophical activity and requires extraordinary vigilance" (147).

For Russell Goodman, in "Thoreau and the Body," Thoreau achieves the Romantic ideal of intimacy with things -- of being at home in the world -- not as a cognitive ego but as a graceful ("poised") body that moves in comfort with itself and its surroundings, even (and perhaps especially) when merely sitting (40-41). Likewise for James Reid, in "Speaking Extravagantly: Philosophical Territory and Eccentricity in Walden," Thoreau is at home in the world the way a carpenter is at home with his tools: the two hang together -- what Cavell, in one of his Emerson essays, calls "the accomplishment of inhabitation" (SW134), which is an event of reception, as of things that, as Reid says, become significant simply by being near at hand (58). And, just so, Philip Cafaro's essay, "In Wildness is the Preservation of the World," reminds us that Thoreau's relation to the world is not one of appropriation -- grasping the world conceptually, making it one's possession -- but is (in keeping with Thoreau's "Civil Disobedience") non-violent: "Find happiness in knowing, experiencing, and being-with nature, rather than in consuming, owning, or transforming it" (89).

This is as much to say, as Rick Furtak argues in "The Value of Being: Thoreau on Appreciating the Beauty of the World," that our relation to what surrounds us is aesthetic -- not, however, in Kant's sense of disinterested aesthetic judgment, but in a more local and contingent sense of openness and reception, which Furtak doesn't hesitate to characterize as "a 'religious attitude' in which all of existence is regarded with wonder, reverence and awe" (115). One could argue that Thoreau's purpose is to "re-enchant" a world that has been evacuated by a culture of scientific inquiry -- which is basically the gist of Alfred Tauber's "Thoreau's Moral Epistemology and Its Contemporary Relevance" (128). The point is argued a bit more dramatically by Edward Mooney in "Wonder and Affliction: Thoreau's Dionysian World," where one's intimacy with the world is, as it was for Thoreau, often laced with tragedy -- Mooney recounts the story of Thoreau's discovery of the dismembered remains of Margaret Fuller, who had drowned in the shark-infested waters off Long Island. Thoreau's mode of response to such an event was not to withdraw into apatheia but on the contrary, to redeem the world by celebrating and even collaborating with its wildness ("I love the wild not less than the good," Thoreau writes in "Higher Laws"). Hence Thoreau's practice of the Stoic virtue of oikeiosis -- "the acquired fit between a fox and its world, for instance its ability to bound naturally through snow" (169): "Thoreau works to modulate touch, better to receive the subtleties of the world. The touch of the eye elicits response. With the sight of the bounding fox, Thoreau bounds in response. Under a silent sky he's patient with silence. As whippoorwills whistle from across the lake, he sings back" (171).

Douglas Anderson, in "An Emerson Gone Mad: Thoreau's American Cynicism," proposes the Cynics rather than the Stoics as the philosophical company Thoreau chose to keep:

 Like the Cynics, he learned experientially nature's laws and the limits these place on us. At the same time, and perhaps even more than the Cynics, he pursued the particularities and contingencies in nature's lessons -- he swam with an unpredictable loon and studied the pond's idiosyncrasies. (189)

Attention to particulars -- attentiveness to what is near at hand or even underfoot -- seems to me the definitive note. If, as Cavell says, "our relation to the world's existence is . . . closer than the ideas of believing and knowing are made to convey" (SW145), it is because these ideas overlook the world, as if from an ideal standpoint (recall Descartes imagining that he has no body). In "Articulating a Huckleberry Cosmos: Thoreau's Moral Ecology of Knowledge," Laura Dassow Wells takes up Thoreau's Wild Fruits, a text left unfinished at the time of his death:

In a series of interlinked essays arranged by season from early spring's elm seeds to the evergreen fruits of winter, some still rudimentary and some quite undeveloped and polished, Thoreau pursues the little, local, neglected fruits, berries, nuts, and seeds of New England, the overlooked weeds of the yard, roadside, forest, and meadow that constitute our daily lived environment. The world-preserving wildness we need crowds in at our doorsteps, ignored and unseen, dismissed as "little things" of no value, neither commercial nor nutritional. (95)

If we ask, what is philosophically important about attention to the "local" and the "little," Walls refers us to Alexander von Humboldt's Cosmos (1845), a work "avidly" read by both Emerson and Thoreau, one that breaks with the tradition of German idealism by figuring the cosmos not as a metaphysical concept, nor even as something made of planets and stars, but as the world of material things -- an ecology of which one is a part and for which one bears a moral responsibility on the order of Heidegger's concept of "care" or "concern" (Sorge):

having to do with something, producing something, attending to something, and looking after it, making use of something, giving something up and letting it go, undertaking, accomplishing, evincing, interrogating, considering, discussing, determining.[4]

Walls's essay (much the best thing in this volume) is especially important for its excellent pages on Thoreau's interest in the materiality and heterogeneity of the languages we speak. Concern or care for such things as wild fruits means attention to the words that are used to pick them out -- not just the scientific terms of herbalists, but the idiomatic references of those who live among them. Walls mentions the everyday talk of Thoreau's friend, the Canadian woodchopper Alex Therein, but more important to Thoreau are the languages of native Americans:

[The] notion that languages are a means to discover truth and that each language reveals a different facet of truth . . . lies behind Thoreau's fascination with multiple languages, and in particular the great weight he put on Indian languages in his late natural history writings, composed at a time when he was filling eleven large notebooks with annotations about Indian words and customs. Thus Wild Fruits is filled with traces of Indian knowledge systems, as Thoreau draws together their words for wild fruits and, with their words, their world, there closeness to the wild that seems to recede westward as Europeans advance from the east. Indian words become the supplement and corrective to our own -- as, for example, when he urges us to drop "the mean name of 'strawberry,'" assigned because the British spread straw under their garden kinds: "Better call it by the Indian name of heart-berry, for it is indeed a crimson heart which we eat at the beginning of summer to make us brave for the rest of the year, as Nature is." (108-9)

Perhaps this makes Thoreau more of an anthropologist than a philosopher, but one could argue that in his approach to language Thoreau is a forerunner of Wittgenstein and Cavell for whom words for things are not universal concepts but local and contingent expressions within different forms of life. It is in any case a Cavell in Thoreau's shoes who brings us up against the limits of philosophy when he says that "universals are neither necessary or even useful in explaining how words and concepts apply to different things" (CR188). Things (like "wild fruits") have histories rather than essences. Otherwise we could never get near them, much less enjoy their taste.

[1] The Claim of Reason: Wittgenstein, Skepticism, Morality, and Tragedy (New York: Oxford University Press, 1979), p. 241. Hereafter CR. Cavell had already formulated the paradox of skepticism in his essay on Shakespeare's King Lear, "The Avoidance of Love" (1967):

We think skepticism must mean that we cannot know the world exists, and hence perhaps there isn't one . . . . Whereas what skepticism suggests is that since we cannot know the world exists its presentness to us cannot be a function of knowing. The world is to be accepted: as the presentness of other minds is not to be known, but acknowledged."

See Must We Mean What We Say (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1969), p. 324. Hereafter MW.

[2] (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1990), esp. pp. 6-12. Hereafter CH.

[3] In Quest of the Ordinary: Lines of Skepticism and Romanticism (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1988), pp. 18-29. On philosophy's reception of Cavell as a writer, see Cavell's recent memoir, Little Did I Know: Excerpts from Memory (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2010), pp. 441-3; esp. p. 442:

In the months before I showed up to teach at Emerson Hall, the philosophers J. Fodor and J. Katz attached the two articles I had submitted (in addition to my dissertation) as evidence in the case for my tenure appointment at Harvard, asserting (I believe I recall the exact words) that the articles were 'deleterious to the future of philosophy.'

[4] Being and Time, trans. John Macquarrie & Edward Robinson (New York: Harper & Row, 1962), p. 82 (I.2.56).