Thought and World: The Hidden Necessities

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James Ross, Thought and World: The Hidden Necessities, University of Notre Dame Press, 2008, 235pp., $28.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780268040574.

Reviewed by Michael Gorman, The Catholic University of America


James Ross's Thought and World is an attempt to do philosophy "without certain constraints that trace to the seventeenth century" (ix); for example, in discussing the mind's abilities, Ross says he wishes to give proper consideration to abstraction, an ability that was "exiled from cognitive theory by mere assumptions after the seventeenth century" (147). To the extent -- considerable, as it turns out -- that he reaches back to past philosophers for inspiration, it is to pre-modern traditions that he turns, above all the Aristotelian-Scholastic tradition. But Thought and World is not an antiquarian exercise. It is not a work of history at all, and it engages contemporary concerns directly, sometimes attacking widely-held views and other times adopting or adapting them. One might say that Ross's intention is to leave the well-marked paths of contemporary philosophy and to strike out across a field where the paths are overgrown, relying on his own sense of direction, but also on some old maps.

The book's eight chapters do not offer a single sustained argument; instead, each paints a different portion of an overall portrait of thought, world, and the relations between them. The first chapter distinguishes necessities that have "earned truth" -- very roughly, those that have honest-to-goodness truth-makers -- from those that have merely "made truth," such as truth-by-stipulative-definition or, more controversially, mathematical and logical truth. The second and third chapters discuss the ontology of possibility and necessity. The fourth examines the nature of truth. The fifth discusses both perception and abstraction. The sixth takes a bit of a detour, arguing that our native ability to abstract reveals our intellects to be in some sense immaterial (for a detailed discussion of Ross's views on this topic, see chapter five of the unpublished doctoral dissertation by Joel Steinmetz, Catholic University of America, 2006). The seventh explores in more detail what, in Ross's view, thought lays hold of. The final chapter is Ross's start on a theory of how people fail to lay hold of the truth: in a nutshell, his view is that imagination, which is crucial for successful thought, is also what leads us astray.

The broad outlines of the resultant picture are as follows. Ross rejects all merely possible entities, whether they be particulars, kinds, or worlds, and he rejects, too, various attempts to get around this rejection: hence he rejects not only possible particulars but also actual haecceities, not only non-actual possible worlds but also actual but non-obtaining worlds, Lewisian worlds, and so forth. In the end, what there is includes only legitimately actual existing entities, and whatever is possible is possible in virtue of them. The world that these make up is a world about which we can and do have true thoughts. Truth is primarily a feature of thought, not of sentences, and it is not adequately understood even as correspondence: truth requires some sort of identity, not mere matching, between what is thought and what is. What there is is knowable because it embodies forms and natures, which Ross likens to software; what there is is knowable by us because we are entities in which natures can come to take up residence, in which they can have esse intentionale, intentional existence.

Given its ambitious scope, the book is fairly short. It is economically written, so much so that thrift sometimes degenerates into stinginess, with the reader wishing that more had been said. For example, Ross claims that thought and its object are, when thinking is true, "really the same" but "not strictly identical," but he nowhere gives us a clear indication of what this comes to. Also on the topic of brevity, it is worth noting that Ross is more concerned with laying out his position on its own terms than with engaging all the latest debates. So while he is certainly interested in some of the central discussions that have characterized analytic philosophy, his discussion of the literature is a bit spotty. The negative side of this is obvious; looking at it more positively, it might be said that Ross's views are sufficiently unconventional that comparing them in detail with their current alternatives would require more time and ink than it would be prudent to expend. At any rate, the book does require some effort on the part of the reader, who must either work out things that Ross does not explain or make connections with the literature that Ross does not make. This effort is well repaid, however.

In the remainder of this review, I focus in more detail on just a few of the many issues the book raises.

If Ross is right about possible worlds ontologies, then an awful lot of people are wrong, not wrong in some details but seriously, seriously wrong. For him, there are no possible worlds or possible entities, only actual entities; whatever is possible is possible in virtue of them. "Explanation winds down to what exists and stops there" (35), and "what exists" for Ross cannot rightly be taken to include infinite arrays of, say, worlds or individuals or haecceities or propositions. Central to Ross's reasoning here is the thought that kinds are not exhausted by individuals: human nature or squirrel nature can never be used up in such a way that a further instance is impossible in principle. Likewise, being is not exhausted by logical division into kinds: another kind can always consistently be added. The upshot is that it is incoherent to talk about all the possible humans or all the possible kinds (32), and ontologies that attempt to do so are themselves incoherent.

This line of attack goes beyond the "blank stare" that David Lewis complained of; there are real arguments here, or at any rate argumentative seeds that deserve to be watered, raised, and examined to determine whether they are fruit-bearing plants or mere weeds. It is impossible to carry all that out in a review, but I would like to focus on the following related issue. On p. 35, Ross says the following:

Supposed possibilities whose overflow de re conditions are not determined by any actual things are merely verbal, de dicto, like griffins, chronons, and hobbits -- not real. Merely verbal possibilities are, in reality, impossible, like my becoming a spider. To call them logical or conceptual possibilities is misleading because, when the overflow conditions are vacant or would be conflicting, there is no possibility at all. (35)

This requires a bit of unpacking. Suppose I say that it is possible for hobbits to exist. I have a certain conception of hobbits, but it leaves many things indeterminate. Their feet are hairy, and they like to eat and smoke, but how long does the typical hobbit pregnancy last? My conception of hobbits has nothing to say on this point, as on many others: such matters overflow my conception and my language. Now if my conception of hobbits is rooted in an actually existing kind, then all is well: the necessities of the hobbit-kind will make true some particular claim about hobbit gestation. In other words, even if some facts are linguistically or conceptually under-determined, they are not under-determined in reality. But since there is no hobbit-kind -- Ross does not accept uninstantiated kinds -- then there is nothing determinate that is named by the word "hobbit," and therefore it is undetermined which kind I am talking about when I attempt to talk about hobbits. (In passing, I remark that thus understood, Ross's claim is similar to Joseph Almog's interpretation of Kripke's claims about unicorns.) As a result, I am deceiving myself if I believe that I am really expressing some real possibility. It is impossible for hobbits to exist.

Now Ross distinguishes two kinds of inadequate possibility-claims. Some involve defective conceptions, while others involve deficient conceptions. Defective conceptions are contradictory; deficient conceptions have no foothold in a real nature and are therefore irremediably under-determined. Ross gives "atomless water" as an example of the former (41). Atomless water is impossible, and we should waste no time wondering what things would be like if water were atomless. That sounds reasonable enough, but what about Ross's claim that deficient conceptions also make our possibility claims false? Granted, something is not quite right with the claim that hobbits are possible, but should we go so far as to say that hobbits are impossible? Why not say instead that when the conception is deficient, the relevant claim is neither true nor false? Ross's idea is that if there is no kind "hobbit," then statements about hobbits are false; this is analogous to Russell's idea that if there is no King of France, then statements about him are false. But what about a so-to-speak Strawsonian alternative according to which statements about hobbits lack truth-value? Going further in that same Strawsonian direction, one could even say that statements like "hobbits might have existed in medieval Oxfordshire" are incapable of being used to make true statements or false statements and are therefore not merely neither true nor false but in fact meaningless.

Now I would like to turn to a question that belongs on the "thought" side of the thought-and-world pair, beginning with one interesting claim of Ross's and then moving on to raise a doubt about something else.

Ross says this: "Human intelligent awareness is continuous and mostly undifferentiated into items; it is more like the scene through a moving window … than it is like a true-false list" (149). Whenever I am awake, I am constantly aware of many things, and this awareness is often or perhaps always judgmental in character: I am aware that it is raining, that the children are talking too loud for me to concentrate on the road, that driving is more dangerous in the rain and therefore requires more concentration than normal, but I do not necessarily formulate all this in a paragraph I am reciting in my head. In this respect, Ross's views on awareness are related to flat-footed versions of Scholastic views in a way that is analogous to the relation between late and early Wittgenstein.

One upshot of all this is that there is more conceiving and judging going on than might at first appear. When I duck to avoid being hit by the pitch, or step to the side of the puddle to avoid splashing myself, many acts of conceiving and judging are involved, not necessarily organized in a linear way, and not necessarily put into words. It would be interesting to compare this understanding of ubiquitous rationality to, say, McDowell's views.

So conception and judgment reach farther down into action and perception than some -- Cartesians, let's call them -- might suppose. But it also seems to be the case that for Ross, perception reaches farther up than some -- Humeans, let's call them -- might suppose. He holds that if we are in possession of suitable conceptions, we can perceive "quite abstract things" (100), like flexibility, conduction, the pyroelectric effect, and so on. But if perception can extend to the pyroelectric effect, then the distinction between thinking and perceiving is starting to disappear. Perhaps Ross worries that distinguishing these operations might lead us back to the fateful line of thought that makes perception so utterly unintelligent that conception seems to be nothing more than an imposition (this would be one way of telling the story of early modern philosophy).

To the extent that he is abandoning the thinking-perceiving distinction, Ross is clearly deviating from his Aristotelian-Scholastic forebears. Whether his proposal is sound or unsound, it is not clear how it follows from the considerations he brings forward. At one point he says of properties like flexibility and radiation that they are "all there in the particulars … right there from the start" (101). What follows from this, however, is not that I can perceive radiation, but only that I can perceive something that is radiating -- it still might be that the radiation itself is something that I can lay hold of only by conception.

More generally, fear of early modern errors is not a good enough reason to do away with the distinction between sensation and conception. The problem with "Humeans" is not that they deny that we perceive intelligible forms, but that they deny that the things we perceive have intelligible forms. If we grant that the things we perceive are intelligible, and that our perception of them does not impede intelligibility but in fact allows it to pass through to the faculty of conception, then we can save the world's accessibility to thought without dropping or even blurring the distinction between sensing and thinking.

To conclude. Philosophers whose understanding of metaphysics and epistemology is limited to what is currently fashionable will probably find this book puzzling. Those who feel the need to consider a wider range of views, and who are willing to work through a book that leaves a significant amount of thinking to them, will find it a fascinating and even worldview-changing look into how Aristotelian-Scholastic ideas can be developed today. If a few follow in Ross's footsteps, the path to truth might come to be more clearly marked.