Thought in Action: Expertise and the Conscious Mind

Placeholder book cover

Barbara Gail Montero, Thought in Action: Expertise and the Conscious Mind, Oxford University Press, 2016, 288pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199596775.

Reviewed by Joseph Mendola, University of Nebraska, Lincoln


Some philosophers, psychologists, and authors of popular self-help books maintain that thinking about what you are doing as you are doing it interferes with your performance. This book argues to the contrary that at least optimal expert performance frequently involves the very sorts of conscious mental processes that these philosophers, psychologists, and authors recommend against.

What is expert performance? Montero reviews and critically discusses various conceptions of experts, as those who perform automatically, have a large store of knowledge, have good reputations among peers, have domain-related experience, are quick studies, and who achieve reproducibly superior performance. But she adopts a somewhat stipulative conception of experts, as adequate for her purposes, as 'individuals who have engaged in ten or more years of deliberative practice, which means close to daily, extended practice with the specific aim of improving, and are still intent on improving.' (p. 64)

Some of the experts on which she hence focuses are professional-level athletes, dancers, chess players, and musicians. Her concern is the place of conscious mental processes in the performance of these sorts of experts.

She advocates the 'Cognition-in-action Principle':

For experts, when all is going well, optimal or near optimal performance frequently employs some of the following conscious mental processes: self-reflective thinking, planning, predicting, deliberation, attention to or monitoring of their actions, conceptualizing their actions, control, trying, effort, having a sense of the self, and acting for a reason. Moreover, such mental processes do not necessarily or even generally interfere with expert performance, and should not generally be avoided by experts. (p. 38)

She argues against a strong so-called 'just-do-it principle', which maintains that for experts, when all is going well, optimal or near-optimal performance proceeds without any of these mental processes, which would, it is claimed, interfere with expert performance. (p. 35) And she also argues against various weaker principles that forbid specific experts merely certain specific mental processes from that long list.

The variety of these mental processes, and the many different kinds of experts there are, may make you wonder how clear and unified the thesis of the book is.

But it is clear that the central examples of expertise in which Montero is interested are those for which there is a relatively clear distinction between practice and performance, between practicing for the game or concert and actually participating in it. And it seems that a key unifying thought of the book is that 'the types of thoughts that have beneficially or at least unproblematically occurred during practice are compatible with performing well', (p. 74) at least as a general rule. While there are some specific sorts of thoughts that are a useful part of practice of certain specific sorts that would interfere with expert performance outside of practice, that is generally not the case according to Montero. Rather, the sorts of conscious mental focus and trying and effort and concentration that are part of the practice periods of these experts are also useful outside of the practice periods. Dancers and athletes and musicians should generally maintain forms of conscious mental discipline, attention, and focus that are useful in practice also during performance. In fact, Montero argues that expertise in such areas characteristically involves an ethic of continuous improvement to which these sorts of conscious mental processes are quite central and crucial.

You may also wonder if Montero's positive claim is interestingly controversial. But she cites a formidable list of prominent psychologists, prominent popular books -- including Eugen Herrigel's Zen in the Art of Archery, Timothy Gallwey's The Inner Game of Tennis, and Malcolm Gladwell's Blink, and even prominent philosophers -- including Hubert Dreyfus, Sean Dorrance Kelly, David Papineau, and David Velleman -- who are her opponents on these topics.

On some conceptions of actions and mental states, some of the mental states advocated by the Cognition-in-action Principle and forbidden by the strong 'just-do-it' principle are ubiquitous and even necessary for action. And this may again make a reader wonder about the interest of Montero's thesis, despite the existence of opponents. For instance, a number of philosophers, including Jennifer Hornsby and Brian O'Shaughnessy, hold that trying is an essential element of all intentional actions, and in truth I find this plausible myself. So it may seem unsurprising when Montero says that trying is important to expert performance. But Montero specifically advocates conscious trying for experts, which is not plausibly ubiquitous. And she engages in a plausible and critical way with standard arguments for the ubiquity of trying of even unconscious sorts.

In fact, many of the most interesting parts of the book involve these sorts of detailed discussions of small-scale parts of Montero's overall position and those of her various sorts of opponents.

Chapter 4 for instance discusses a number of psychological treatments of the phenomenon of choking in performance under pressure -- by Richard Masters, Sian Beilock, Roy Baumeister, and others -- which suggest that in these cases anxiety causes individuals to consciously control and attend to processes that were better left unconscious, and that this conscious control interferes with performance. In this discussion, Montero identifies a number of flaws in the arguments of these authors, who for instance are quick to draw inferences about expert performance from experiments on those who are not experts, quick to draw inferences about real world situations from very artificial experimental conditions, and who overlook alternative plausible explanations. I was similarly convinced by Montero's negative treatment in Chapter 5 of the arguments of psychologists and philosophers that there are situations (for instance involving race-car driving, or action in the fog of war, or emergency-room nursing) where experts must act under time constraints that allow no room for thinking.

There are also interesting detailed discussions( Chapters 7 and 8) of the relations between trying, effort, and expert performance. Despite arguing that trying is not ubiquitous in action, Montero usefully distinguishes various different forms of effortful trying that are plausibly important to optimal expert performance. And despite finding effortful trying important to expert performance, she also develops an at least initially plausible account of apparent effortlessness as a positive aesthetic property of certain sorts of bodily performance in athletics and dance.

Another valuable aspect of the book is Montero's extended attention to certain specific examples of expertise and performance, examples that should probably receive more intense philosophical attention than they customarily get, for instance from aestheticians and philosophers of mind and action theorists.

Montero was a professional ballet dancer, and so there are interesting discussions of dance throughout the book. For instance, in Chapters 9 and 10 she argues that thoughts about and proprioceptive awareness of bodily movements are often a crucial part of expert dancing, and that indeed proprioception can be, in such cases, an aesthetic sense that allows dancers to perceive the grace, beauty, power, and precision of their own movements. Indeed, such aesthetically-sensitive proprioception may also stand behind even an onlooker's aesthetic response to a dance, she argues.

Chapter 11 is an extended discussion of expert chess, particularly of very fast forms like lightning chess. Here Montero deploys plausible arguments against 'just-do-it' treatments of lightning chess by the philosophers Dreyfus and John McDowell. Her arguments depend on what the expert players themselves say about their performances and not just what philosophers imagine they would say. Throughout the book there is a laudable attention to interviews with experts of the various sorts under discussion, not only with dancers and chess players, but also with athletes, musicians, and nurses in emergency rooms. There is very helpful attention throughout to very concrete evidence provided both by empirical studies in psychology and related fields and also by the experts themselves. This evidence is sometimes anecdotal, but the anecdotes are often telling.

There is of course always room for complaint. The book is consciously written in such a way that individual chapters can stand more or less on their own. This has advantages, but it involves repetition and some minor damage to the clarity and unity of the overall argument. I would have preferred something somewhat more tightly constructed. But this is a minor matter.

Thought in Action is convincing in its overall argument that philosophers and psychologists are mistaken when they denigrate the usefulness of conscious thought to optimal expert performance. And it also provides a detailed discussion of kinds of expert performance -- in dance, athletics, music, medicine, and chess -- that will be of interest to those who work in philosophy of mind and psychology, aesthetics, and action theory, whatever their concern with this overall thesis.