Thought's Footing: A Theme in Wittgenstein's Philosophical Investigations

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Charles Travis, Thought's Footing: A Theme in Wittgenstein's Philosophical Investigations, Oxford University Press, 2006, 217pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199291465.

Reviewed by James C. Klagge, Virginia Tech


This book is no easy read, and it couldn't have been an easy listen when it took life as a series of lectures.  It is the longest 217-page book I have read, and not just because of the small print.  Sentences tend to be elegant and difficult to construe -- indeed, elegantly difficult to construe.  I happened to find sentences of 75 words (p. 116), 83 words (p. 126), and 110 words (p. 176).  Elegant, difficult to construe, and long makes for tough-going.

Yet, for all that, the book was worth reading.  It reminds us of the anti-Fregean and in fact anti-Platonic force of Wittgenstein's later work.  From several different angles Travis pounds away against the notion that a correspondence theory of truth could be plausible -- that statements, thoughts, propositions could be "made" true, or false, by how things stand in the world tout court.  Travis's main point did not seem strikingly new, but it was explained and illustrated in plausible ways.  This is an important accomplishment, since Wittgenstein's views, especially his later views, tend to be readily ignored or dismissed.

Travis emphasizes the Fregean background to these issues.  He takes as a "central methodological principle" (p. 1): "if you want to understand what Wittgenstein is up to at some given point in the Investigations, always look to Frege -- to how what Wittgenstein says may be a reaction to something Frege said".  The support for this principle, he says, is "its fruits."  The fruits turn out to be abundant.  But Frege stands in a line of thought running from Socrates and Plato to an earlier incarnation of Wittgenstein in the Tractatus.  When Wittgenstein himself set out the targets of his later work, it was these others that he mentioned.  In dictations to Waismann for Schlick (Voices of Wittgenstein, 2003, p. 33) he said: "I can characterize my standpoint no better than by saying that it is the antithetical standpoint to the one occupied by Socrates in the Platonic dialogues."  And in the Preface to the Investigations (p. vi) Wittgenstein noted that he had originally intended to "publish those old thoughts [the Tractatus] and the new ones [a 1943 precursor to the Investigations] together" in a single volume, for "the latter could be seen in the right light only by contrast with and against the background of my old way of thinking."  But Travis thinks that Frege set out the views in question -- indeed, all of his views -- in an especially clear fashion.  (Oddly, when Travis actually quotes or cites passages from Frege, he does so only with reference to German editions of those works.)

The substance and strength of Travis's book is found in a series of examples he uses to make his and Wittgenstein's case.  It is a relief to see writing about Wittgenstein made concrete.  Travis's basic point is that statements/propositions/thoughts (in Frege's sense) do not objectively, of themselves, determine what would make them true (or false).  Such determinings are inherently parochial -- dependent upon particular circumstances or construals of the language.  A given statement can be "a move in many different [language] games, each of which would assign it a different condition of correctness" (p. 24).  Among the examples are: Looking at Lake Michigan: "The water is blue today" (p. 32).  Does this, or does it not, require individual samples of the water (in a beaker, say) to be blue?  "My car is blue" (p. 33).  Does this, or does it not, require all of its parts to be blue?  "I present you with this gold watch" (p. 127).  Does this require all of its parts to be made of gold?  "The shoes are under the bed" (p. 120).  Is this made true by shoes that are located beneath the bed but three floors down?  "The cat has mange" (p. 181).  Is this still true if the mites have been killed but the condition of the fur has not yet recovered?  And the example he uses recurrently: "Sid grunts" (p. 108).  (Travis must not be a tennis fan, as it is hard to discuss this kind of case without thinking of Maria Sharapova.)  Does this describe a socially inappropriate habit, or a physiologically appropriate capacity when struck in the solar plexus?

In many of these cases, though not all, there is a natural answer to give -- circumstances would have to be rather special for another answer to be appropriate.  But this is just the point -- what is natural is not necessary or metaphysically determinate, and circumstances or purposes are relevant after all.  And in some of these cases, like "Sid grunts", it's not at all clear what is at stake -- what is being claimed -- except in some context or another.

One might suppose that these sorts of problems are simply due to vagueness or ambiguity.  The sentences in question, Frege might say, do not actually express thoughts -- just as "It is hot" does not express a thought until it is supplemented with where and when.  Once the thought is fully articulated, then it is determinate what would make it true (or false).  Here we may seem to be presented with a matter of taste -- do we prefer to build all the circumstantial detail into the thought itself, so that there is then an objective set of truth conditions, or do we prefer to allow the thought to be indeterminate, and have the truth conditions be relative to circumstances and purposes?  Frege's way, or Wittgenstein's?  But Travis's point is that Frege's way is illusory.  There is no building everything in from the start.  If we insist that thoughts be fully determinate, then it remains a question as to exactly which thought is being accessed by a given (less than fully determinate) sentence.  And further, it is not clear what it means for a thought to be fully determinate.

We might try supposing that each term in a sentence -- each concept -- must have a definition, which determines its extension.  (Readers may recall the trouble this sort of assumption -- Axiom V -- got Frege into in his Grundgesetze.)  But the problem is not just whether there must be fully determinate definitions (cf. Wittgenstein's family resemblances), but what that determinacy could consist in.  Recent work on reference, by Kripke and others, has made it seem as though we could discover what the essence of, say, water was.  If so, then that essence, and presumably its extension, would be what it is objectively -- independently of us.  But it is unclear how that could be so.  Whether water is all isotopes of H2O, or only its most common isotope, is not something we could discover -- it is something we must decide (a point first made by Keith Donnellan).  Or rather, which of those counts as water depends on our purposes and intents in using the term.  Supposing we were to do some genetic engineering on cows; are the results cows?  Stephen Toulmin recalls (Philosophy of Science: An Introduction, 1953, p. 51): "Wittgenstein … remarked, 'what is or is not a cow is for the public to decide'."

Travis brings these issues back to Wittgenstein's famous remark (PI §242): "If language is to be a means of communication there must be agreement not only in definitions but also (queer as this may sound) in judgments."  A slightly different version of this passage appears in the Remarks on the Foundations of Mathematics (revised edition, p. 343):

We say that, in order to communicate, people must agree with one another about the meanings of words.  But the criterion for this agreement is not just agreement with reference to definitions, e.g., ostensive definitions -- but also an agreement in judgments.  It is essential for communication that we agree in a large number of judgments.

One might have supposed that agreement about definitions just determined judgments, as Socrates seemed to suppose (Euthyphro, 6e): "Tell me then what this form itself is, so that I may look upon it and, using it as a model, say that any action of yours or another's that is of that kind is pious, and if it is not that it is not."  What Travis's examples are meant to show is how much judgment remains -- what counts as being "under," being "blue," "having" mange, being a grunter, in these circumstances, for these purposes.  Even if each of these things could be sorted out in retrospect -- precisified, disambiguated -- it is implausible to suppose that such precisifications, disambiguations already exist, so to speak, in advance of their being called on and descried.  There is no notion of definition that eliminates the need for judgment.

But perhaps all these problems are due to the vagaries of ordinary language.  Frege, of course, distrusted ordinary language and did not expect it to live up to his strictures.  Russell and the early Wittgenstein took this concern to heart in their theory of logical atomism.  Perhaps our ordinary concepts do not reach out and grab the world as they stand -- on their own.  But, surely, at some deeper level (for Russell this was the level of sense data, for Wittgenstein it remained unspecified) language -- a logically perfect language -- must reach out and touch the world.  At this basic level there would be no need for precisification, disambiguation, or relativization.  All of that would have been taken care of in the process of analysis and reduction.  While Travis does not discuss this maneuver, its only real advantage is that we can't so easily find counter-examples to it, since we don't know what the level is (early Wittgenstein), or we don't really have a language of sense data (Russell) to test it against.

In the end, the force of this book is to question the notion of truth-makers (that which "makes" propositions, etc., true or false).  Rather than raising the easy questions -- what makes moral, modal, mathematical or negative existential claims true -- it raises the harder question of what makes ordinary factual claims true.  The answer is that nothing in itself can play that role.  Only things as understood in one way or another, by some or others of us, for some purpose or another, can play that role.  A lesson worth remembering.