Three Big Bangs: Matter-Energy, Life, Mind

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Holmes Rolston III, Three Big Bangs: Matter-Energy, Life, Mind, Columbia University Press, 2010, 160pp., $24.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780231156394.

Reviewed by Brendon M. H. Larson, University of Waterloo


Humans have sought grand cosmologies to explain existence from the very beginning, and recently there have been increasing attempts to adopt a story from the natural sciences (e.g., Swimme and Berry 1992; Rue 2000; Chaisson 2001; Abrams and Primack 2011). In his latest book, Holmes Rolston III adds to these, glorifying the universe through the story of three sequential "big bangs" that have given rise to human experience. The first big bang was, of course, the account from astrophysics of the origin of the universe, but Rolston argues that the subsequent origin of life (introducing "proactive, agentive" information into the universe) and of the human mind were equally big bangs through which emerged entirely new possibility spaces. He adopts "big bang" as a "metaphor for critical, exponential, nonlinear bursts" (p. ix), alongside alternatives such as "explosion," "singularity," or "phase transition." In three clearly written chapters, he justifies the significance of each big bang, tying them into a coherent account of universal evolution.

Whatever else this book might be, it is one punctuated by superlatives: one learns that a person contains more atoms (1028) than there are stars in the universe (p. 18), that DNA replication occurs at the speed of a jet plane (p. 50), and that the number of potential human thoughts (1070,000,000,000) is vastly more than the number of atoms in the visible universe (1080, p. 95). Rolston's account certainly makes you feel lucky to be part of and aware of existence: many physicists cannot help but question whether the universe was fine-tuned by the first big bang for the origin of life such as ourselves, and it really does seem remarkable that we're here and able to reflect at all. There appears to be no reason the universe couldn't have had alternate laws, but the ones it does have are just right (the so-called anthropic principle). As just one of multiple examples, if the expansion rate of the universe had been infinitesimally smaller or greater, it would not have existed long enough for life to evolve (p. 17). The "matheomorphic" structure of the universe further suggests that mind underlies it all (p. 6).

A recurring theme for Rolston is whether the subsequent big bangs were predestined from the first or whether they were governed by chance. He reviews the arguments of scholars who conclude that the evolution of life was contingent as opposed to those who conclude that if you re-ran the tape life-forms remarkably similar to those we see around us would have evolved. By the end, though, one could query the pragmatic value of the question: Rolston concludes that life is "remarkable" (p. 83) whether inevitable or contingent, whether based on nomothetic laws, idiographic events, or an admixture of both.

Throughout, the book heavily relies on Rolston's interpretation of contemporary science and in my view falls prey to scientism. Rolston acknowledges that the precision of mathematics and physics only scratches the surface of life's complexity and that a "theory of everything" would not account for the "infinitely complex" (p. 49) scale of the human being, but he doesn't take this far enough. In particular, his final big bang relies on his account of the distinctiveness of humans relative to other animals based on frequent comparison to our closest relatives, the apes. The problem is that, within the past few years, renowned journals have published evidence of self-awareness (based on mirror self-recognition) in not just humans and great apes, as he assumes, but also dolphins, elephants, rhesus monkeys, and, within another vertebrate class, in the magpie (Plotnik et al. 2006, 2011; Prior et al. 2008; Rajala et al. 2010). Recent evidence also suggests that "ravens may be sensitive to the emotions of others" (Fraser et al. 2010). Though human culture and language may be distinctive, providing support for the claim that "Humans are a radically new kind of species on Earth" (p. 113), there is increasing evidence for an evolutionary continuity of animal consciousness and significant questions still remain. At the very least, these recent results raise further questions about whether the discreteness of the "big bang" metaphor is appropriate for the evolutionary realm.

In this context, it is critical to recollect the extent to which such scientific findings are shaped by the questions we ask. Rolston observes that "we humans, even smart scientists, could only recognize minds with considerable similarity to our own" (p. 111). As Frans de Waal (2000) has pointed out, for example, Western studies of animal consciousness lagged behind the Japanese because of mistaken assumptions tied to our cultural habitus. Rolston's brief dismissal of social constructivism thus misses the point. In the case of "galaxies and fossils," it may be "irrational to deny that such [scientific] discoveries are of what is objectively there" (p. xi), but especially in areas of life and consciousness -- where our reductionist science has not yet proven itself -- it is not so irrational. It is worth keeping in mind that Lord Kelvin stated in 1900 that "There is nothing new to be discovered in physics now. All that remains is more and more precise measurement." Many would argue that statements about consciousness are similarly premature because we have by no means solved the "hard problem of consciousness," the experience of qualia, so Rolston’s argument is weak to the extent it hinges on a discrete boundary between human mind and no-mind. Although Rolston claims that "most hold that felt experience, psyche, requires neurons" (p. 67), we simply don't know, which he later acknowledges when he states that "it is difficult to know" whether cnidarians experience feelings; he does indicate that earthworms suffer. It's not just new age nonsense to consider the possibility that other organisms, despite their different and often smaller brains, have capacities or sensitivities that we don't even fathom.

This problem relates to another. Humans may excel in some capacities, but more does not mean better. As in so many past cosmological syntheses, there is an undeniable sense of progress here whose cutting edge is through the human mind. On the one hand, this is a move in the right direction, because in the 1800s the cutting edge was the British mind alone; but, on the other hand, this is still very much a mind defined by the Enlightenment and modern science. I am not so beholden to the belief that our big brains are the highlight of existence: "The human being is the most sophisticated of known natural products. The human brain … is the most complex entity known in the universe" (p. 49). Kurt Vonnegut (1985) wrote a wonderful book, Galápagos, where the "only real villain [is] the oversize human brain" (p. 270), the very brain that Rolston lauds. Rolston does not escape the circularity that our minds are doing the valuing and thereby find themselves of most value -- just as fish, able to survive underwater, which dominates three-quarters of the earth's surface, would, if asked, conclude that they are the most highly evolved life-form on the planet. More is not necessarily better and even a more "objective" form of more, such as complexity, still simply reflects something that we as humans value.

Finally, given Rolston's eminent contributions to environmental ethics, it was disappointing that he didn't extend his argument a bit further in this direction. I would have been more satisfied with the result if he had. In his account, other beings are just precursors on the linear path to the "explosion" of human mind. In one small aside he points out that "the species appearing at the third big bang puts this life on Earth in jeopardy" (p. 83), but might this suggest that we're evolutionary laggards in some very important dimensions? I remain unconvinced that we are the "Homo that is so sapiens" (p. xi). In the face of our troubled ability to get along and to live well on the planet, the hubris that we are wise provides little space for much needed humility about our place in the world. It gives little value to the ways of knowing of other species and human cultures, which are both different from our own and rapidly disappearing. Again quoting Vonnegut (1985, p. 185), "I have yet to see an octopus, or any sort of animal, for that matter, which wasn't entirely content to pass its time on earth as a food gatherer, to shun the experiments with unlimited greed and ambition performed by humankind." Our success is not without its shadow side.

Focusing on the diversity of human cultures, it is unclear why Rolston's account, based on contemporary science, should be prioritized over the many pre-existing ones. He recognizes that other cultures and traditions adopt alternative metaphors to our current computer-oriented ones (p. 9), but he doesn't justify his selection over these others. If he is correct that the human mind is the fount of universal creativity, it is inexcusable to neglect the full possibility space available through the diverse ways that human cultures live within the world. When he states that "one needs encounter with the nature of these three big bangs … to become a three-dimensional person" (p. x), he excludes the myriad people who live entirely rich lives without a hint of it, founded in less rationalistic and more tangible grounding.

Drawing together some of these threads, I conclude that despite its merits the major shortcoming of this work is that it is difficult to imagine how anyone could live within this worldview. Rolston seeks the "elemental, fundamental givens we encounter in nature" (p. x) to build a worldview, but this truly is a view as opposed to a Weltanschauung. Being amazed and feeling awe for existence is one thing, but care and compassion for it is something else. Rolston lauds human "epistemic genius" and the instrumentation that allows science to "extend our native ranges of perception" because it "dis-embodies us. It distances us from our embodiment" (p. 112). The question is whether the natural human state is such disembodied objectivity or, rather, a more embodied form of living in particular places -- the fundamental givens of the rising and setting sun, the song of birds, the patter of rain overhead. This is not to deny the value of scientific knowledge, but instead points to the hubris of emphasizing it as the way of knowing. It is not objectivity that matters so much as meaningfulness, and it is questionable whether Rolston's cosmology will help us to live on the Earth.

It is telling that Rolston's concluding sentence turns from science to mystery and the possibility of God: "Maybe we are not so lonely after all; our presence is embraced by another Presence" (p. 124). This reminds me of the old yarn about scientists scaling the mountain of inquiry and finally reaching its peak, only to encounter a band of contemplatives who have been there for centuries. If Rolston is right that "The last big explosion in the universe is in your head" (p. 115), then it is as important for each of us to begin exploring there as to rely on science to tell us what is going on inside our own heads.


Abrams, N. E. and J. R. Primack. 2011. The New Universe and the Human Future: How a Shared Cosmology Could Transform the World. New Haven: Yale University Press.

Chaisson, E. J. 2001. Cosmic Evolution: The Rise of Complexity in Nature. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

de Waal, F. 2000. "Reading Nature's Tea Leaves." Natural History, December 2000/January 2001.

Fraser, O. N. and T. Bugnyar. 2010. "Do Ravens Show Consolation? Responses to Distressed Others." PLoS ONE 5 (5): e10605.

Plotnik, J. M., F. B. M. de Waal, and D. Reiss. 2006. "Self-recognition in an Asian Elephant." Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences (U.S.A.) 103: 17053-17057.

Plotnik, J. M., R. Lair, W. Suphachoksahakun, and F. B. M. de Waal. 2011. "Elephants Know When They Need a Helping Trunk in a Cooperative Task." Proceedings of the National Academy of Sciences (U.S.A.) 108: 5116-5121.

Prior, H., A. Schwarz, and O. Gunturkun. 2008. "Mirror-induced Behavior in the Magpie (Pica pica): Evidence of Self-recognition." PLoS Biology 6(8): 1642-1650.

Rajala, A. Z., K. R. Reininger, K. M. Lancaster, and L. C. Populin. 2010. "Rhesus Monkeys (Macaca mulatta) Do Recognize Themselves in the Mirror: Implications for the Evolution of Self-Recognition." PLoS ONE 5 (9): e12865.

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Vonnegut, K. 1985. Galápagos. New York: Delacorte Press.