Three Essays on Religion

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John Stuart Mill, Three Essays on Religion, Louis J. Matz (ed.), Broadview Press, 2009, 302pp., $18.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781551117683.

Reviewed by Julie C. Van Camp, California State University



This splendid volume brings together three intriguing essays on religion by John Stuart Mill, “Nature”, “Utility of Religion”, and “Theism”. First published by his stepdaughter Helen Taylor in 1874, the year after his death, they will be as surprising to many readers as they reportedly were to his contemporaries. His earlier works had led many to conclude that he was dismissive of religion, while the essays here confound those presumptions.

The three essays have been available in print for many years in other editions. The special value of this collection for both scholarship and teaching comes from the extensive supplementary material so helpful in carefully interpreting the essays today. This material includes sixteen earlier statements by Mill in other writings, both published essays and letters. Excerpts from three contemporary reviews of the three essays sharpen the issues. The volume also includes excerpts from Jeremy Bentham and Mill’s father, James Mill, who apparently exerted early influence on Mill on these matters. There are also excerpts from Charles Darwin and T. H. Huxley that address related issues in religion and science.

A detailed bibliography with suggestions for further reading enhances the volume, as does the chronology of Mill’s life, and numerous portraits of Mill, his wife Harriet Taylor, and other influential persons in his life. Although, regrettably, it has no index, this is an unusually comprehensive, worthwhile, and usable volume.

Throughout the essays, Mill seems determined to reconcile his empiricist commitment to supporting beliefs with sufficient evidence and his moral commitment to improving the condition of humans in this life. But as his stepdaughter asserts in the essay she wrote for their publication in 1874, the three essays were not intended as “forming a consecutive series” and thus should not be considered “a connected body of thought” (p. 62). Even so, Taylor insists, Mill considered the three “fundamentally consistent” (p. 62). She provides persuasive evidence to support her conclusion from the sequence of Mill’s preparation of the material and from Mill’s his intent.

The volume’s editor, Louis J. Matz, argues convincingly in his invaluable introduction that the posthumous essays are at least consistent with views in Mill’s published and unpublished writings. The best known of those views is Mill’s observation that he did not need theistic beliefs, since he was brought up imbued with the importance of morality.

Matz also hints at a variety of motivations for Mill to keep quiet about his religious views during his lifetime. As a member of Parliament, he did not want people to be able to use his religious views, regardless of what they were, against him in his bid for election (p. 36). Private correspondence hints that Mill was also concerned that an appearance of sympathy for religion might interfere with his public reputation as a reformer based on moral principles independent of religion. Mill’s apparent conflicts between his public profile and private morality anticipates dilemmas of progressive politicians today. It is inconceivable that a politician who is openly atheist or even agnostic could get elected to high public office, at least in the U.S., but excessive commitment to a rigid theology can be equally damning in some quarters.

Mill lived in an era when rapidly developing scientific explanations for natural phenomena were increasingly challenging traditional religious explanations. Matz suspects Mill judged that religion might still be useful for promoting morality, even if the intellectual underpinnings of theism were increasingly implausible, a dilemma shared in heightened relief today, given the advancement of scientific explanation.

In the essay “Nature”, Mill meticulously presents detailed arguments against Natural Law as the basis for ethics. He concludes that either of the two main senses of “nature” (“the entire system of things” or “things as they would be, apart from human intervention”) result in models for action that are “irrational and immoral” (p. 103). He distinguishes religion in the traditional supernatural sense of theism from what he calls a Religion of Humanity (p. 130). The latter idealizes goods in this world, specifically, the promotion of happiness for all beings, consistently with his utilitarianism and also with what we might today call secular humanism.

In the second essay, “Utility of Religion”, Mill acknowledges one advantage of supernatural religion over his proposed Religion of Humanity, namely, the hope of “a life after death” (p. 135). Nevertheless Mill is suspicious of “legislators and moralists” exploiting this quest for an afterlife to coerce people to do certain things in this life. He hopes that as the quality of life in the here and now improves, this dream of an afterlife will become less important. As the editor points out, a contemporary critic of this essay anticipates William James’ “Will to Believe” (p. 46), arguing that religious experience can open up “new realities”, much as Mill’s ideas of personal love can open up such realities.

In “Theism”, Mill considers a range of arguments for the existence of God, using a methodology consistent with his lifelong insistence on evidence. He believes it to be “indispensable” that

religion should from time to time be reviewed as a strictly scientific question, and that its evidences should be tested by the same scientific methods, and on the same principles as those of any of the speculative conclusions drawn by physical science (p. 141).

Given that evidentiary emphasis, he concludes that monotheism is superior to polytheism, as the latter cannot be reconciled to any theory of governance of the universe, although this alone hardly proves the truth of monotheism (p. 143).

Mill acknowledges that he cannot disprove the existence of a sovereign will, and proceeds to examine a variety of arguments, both a priori and a posteriori, for such an existence. The argument for a first cause, he concludes, would be of no value for the proof of theism (p. 154). He then considers the argument “from the general consent of mankind”, viz., that as all persons have recognized some form of god, there must be a god. Mill argues that the diverse conceptions of such a god and the universal need to address unknowns in life account for this universality, not necessarily the existence of any actual god. He also rejects arguments from consciousness and pure reason, appealing to Kant’s distinctions between speculative reason and a corresponding reality outside the mind (pp. 158-161).

Mill finds the argument from design far more significant, in part because it lends itself to testing by the scientific method he holds paramount (p. 161). Surprisingly perhaps, given his rejection of so many other claimed proofs of the existence of god, he admits that “the adaptations in Nature afford a large balance of probability in favour of creation of intelligence” (p. 166). Lest any contemporary proponents of Intelligent Design rush to cite Mill for support, however, note that he qualifies this conclusion by pointing to the limits of “the present state of our knowledge”. In other words, although he was familiar with Darwin’s The Origin of Species (1859), Mill acknowledged that, in the mid-nineteenth century, we did not yet know enough about the natural world to account for all the then-current conditions of the species. Concluding that he could not rule out the argument from design is a far cry from concluding that it proved the existence of a deity. Further, his critics at the time thought he had not sufficiently understood the power of Darwin’s work (p. 49).

Even granting the possibility of an Intelligent Designer, Mill wonders what sort of god that would be. He questions why human beings were not designed “to last longer, and not to get so easily and frequently out of order” (p. 170). Here he anticipates recent challenges to the contemporary intelligent design movement. If god is omnipotent, could he not have come up with a better design for our aching backs and fragile knees? Mill also notes that there is no evidence in the world we inhabit of divine benevolence or divine justice (p. 177).

In this final essay, he again considers the promise of an afterlife (p. 179ff). Mill concludes that there is no way to prove or disprove its existence, but he concedes that it might be of comfort to many people. He also dismisses claims that revelation received by persons proves anything about the existence of god or anything else.

These essays, along with the extensive supplementary material in this volume, provide the basis for exciting and detailed analysis by student and scholar alike, the sort of comprehensive, contextual work in the history of philosophy that brings old texts into contemporary life. The context furnished for these materials also provides safeguards against reading passages in ways that would distort Mill’s views. The essays were published posthumously, and there is evidence, at least with the “Theism” essay, that Mill did not intend for it ever to be published. He surely did not have time for the editing and clarification that might have discouraged provocative misreadings. The book provides the tools for exceptional scholarship and teaching regarding Mill’s views on religion, and for that we can all be grateful.