Through Vegetal Being: Two Philosophical Perspectives

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Luce Irigaray and Michael Marder, Through Vegetal Being: Two Philosophical Perspectives, Columbia University Press, 2016, 251pp., $28.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780231173872.

Reviewed by Elaine P. Miller, Miami University


In Nostalgia, her recent book about the relationship between longing for and feeling at home, Barbara Cassin argues for a new way of thinking about rootedness, envisioning a world free from belonging in the sense of nationality or the privileging of the mother tongue. This joint project by Luce Irigaray and Michael Marder, provides one way of thinking about this possibility. The book could be described as a nostalgic undertaking, one which conceives of nature, and in particular vegetal being, as a home, a realm prior to culture, language, and social relations, to which we can retreat or appeal in response to inauthentic forms of being-in-the-world.

Marder burst onto the broader philosophical scene in 2013 with Plant-Thinking: A Philosophy of Vegetative Life, which recounts, partly in response to the turn in philosophy toward the consideration of the non-human animal, how a discourse "rooted in vegetal life" might articulate the "non-transcendental conditions of possibility" for humans to encounter plants, rather than obscurely trying to know them as objects. The book aimed to present plant-life as it really exists by "letting it be," a process that entailed, in the author's words, "profound obscurity."[1] Plant-thinking in this work referred not only to the (as far as we can imagine it) non-cognitive mode of thinking proper to plants themselves, but also to human thinking about plants and the possible effect that thinking about and encountering the vegetal world might have on humans. In particular Marder suggested that such a project might further the de-humanization of human thinking, rendering it to a certain degree plant-like.

Marder places his writing on plant thinking in the context of the "weak thinking" described by Gianni Vattimo and Santiago Zabal as the rejection of the pursuit of any developed philosophical system in order to avoid the violence of systematicity, embracing only the weak right to "interpret, vote and live" and seek "ontological emancipation from truth and other concepts that frame and restrict the possibilities of new philosophical, scientific, or religious revolutions."[2] Marder's self-professed project was to articulate vegetative life in a way that was free from the categories, measures, and frames imposed by any given metaphysics.

Marder's work on vegetal being attracted the attention of Irigaray, who was drawn to it by what she calls his account of the ways in which the vegetal world can provide "a limit to deconstruction" (5). Although Irigaray does not elaborate on this claim, which is a bit puzzling in that Marder's earlier work tended to align plant thinking with and not against deconstruction, we come to understand how Irigaray and Marder came together to write this volume, which recounts, through autobiography, personal reflection, and philosophical musing, common or at least interrelated themes in the two thinkers' relationships to and conceptualization of the vegetal world. The book consists of two parts in which Irigaray and Marder respectively reflect on a series of themes, organized into two sets of sixteen chapters. The book is a kind of dialogue at a distance between two people who find themselves transplanted, fragile, and seeking solace in the plant world.

Despite the quasi-epistolary format (the Prologues of each author's section and the Epilogue are letters to the other), the two halves intentionally communicate to each other only obliquely, by attending to the same themes (215). Their approach to vegetal being is, although on the surface parallel, in fact quite distinct, as Marder notes in his Prologue. He asks of Irigaray's familiar concept of sharing the world at least between two, "My question for you in this regard is: How many worlds participate in this relation? Yours and mine, to be sure, as well as, perhaps, our shared world. But what about plants? Do they, too, have or constitute a world?" (112) Both Irigaray and Marder write about a relationship that involves the vegetal world, but whereas for Irigaray vegetal being, for the most part, provides a space of refuge from, renewal of, and transformation of human experience, for Marder the relationship is one we have with plants directly.

In Irigaray's section, we learn some new things and are reminded of some familiar themes. She grew up with a loving grandfather who took her on adventures in nature, fishing, looking for birds' nests, and gardening. As a child she would go on hunger strikes if her parents suggested summer camp or boarding school, and only in the garden could she find calm. As an adult she has given up driving, flying in an airplane, and eating meat. Much of the first part of the book recounts her anger and hurt at being dismissed from her teaching position at the University of Paris and expelled from the Lacanian school of psychoanalysis subsequent to the publication of her revolutionary work Speculum: of the Other Woman. The distress of these life events pushed her to a realization, she writes, that the intellectual and cultural tradition into which she was born neglects life.

The theme of life is one of the most prevalent in the book. A strong theme in Irigaray's work Between East and West, life here takes on a less reciprocal significance than in her earlier figures of two lips, the mother-daughter relation, and the placenta. Here she decidedly counterpoises life, which "escapes representation" (16) and can "hardly be communicated" (7), to "cultural construction" (12), whereas in her earlier works, such as Je, Tu, Nous and This Sex Which is Not One, the placenta aided the mother and child in forming an "almost ethical" relation (41), and the two lips formed an alternate figure to the monolithic phallus in service of a new universal or a feminine subjectivity. Here, vegetal being, while personified as a mother, surrounds the adult Luce with an immediate, literally self-less care, forming a kind of "aerial placenta" that purifies her breath "without asking for anything in return" (21). That "there is air," she writes, is enough; she does not need any "other" at this point (22).[3] In a brief analysis, Irigaray describes life as a time before human intersubjectivity, before "the institutional conflict in which Creon opposed Antigone" (19). This fantasized "life itself" prior to human techne evoked in contact with vegetal nature is a time before historical time. Cut off from its natural source, she writes, the earth has fallen prey to man's fabrication (33), and thus to nihilistic forces.

Correlative to the search for life itself prior to human construction Irigaray includes here sometimes odd rants at technology and contemporary life. Contemporary minds have become a "hard disk" that only takes in what our education has imposed on us (81). Most contemporary people, she writes, perceive and feel little other than what "advertisement recommends them to feel" (42). In a uniquely poignant moment, she admits that she sometimes rides the subway just to be with other people, only to find that the others on the train do nothing but open up their laptops, cutting themselves off from human contact.

As in Between East and West, the spiritual traditions of the East eventually aid Irigaray with integrating living and thinking, receiving and sharing energy, and cultivating the breath uniting body and logos, although the description of her engagement with these traditions is drawn with somewhat broad strokes. It would have been really interesting, for example, if she had connected the cultivation of sensory perception (a concept she draws from Patanjali's Yoga Sutras) and the correlative transformation in language that can follow this conversion with the philosophical implications of an engagement with vegetal being. The brief discussion suggests that the way in which we see natural as well as human-made things should emphasize not their conceptual or nominal fixedness, but their living, becoming nature. A more developed account of the continuous relationship between bodily sensation and the evolution of logos would have cohered well with the strong undercurrent of Nietzschean inspiration throughout Irigaray's half of the book.

Irigaray repeatedly invokes Nietzsche's search for a feminine companion, leading one to possibly draw the conclusion that this book is a kind of Marine Lover of Friedrich Nietzsche reinterpreted through plant life. Chapters eight and nine are full of allusions to Thus Spoke Zarathustra, including a discussion of incarnation ("Zarathustra wants to become human again,") a move back among people and a search for companions ("living companions I need"), a critique of the forgetting of natural existence ("remain faithful to the earth"), and finally a call against moralism and for the revaluation of all values. She turns to Shiva as a figure of, in her words, a "new Zarathustra" who can assure a transition between West and East, one who also needs a suitable feminine companion to "awaken his masculine energy" (73). Shiva, she writes, chose the forest rather than the mountains and ice that were Zarathustra's preference; in a like manner, she opts for the refuge of vegetal being over the sterility of the logos. Surprisingly, Irigaray appears unaware of how fundamentally her work has contributed to the undoing and refiguration of the latter.

Marder's half of the book begins with an account of his upbringing marked by constant displacement and a resulting feeling of uprootedness and nonbelonging: from Russia to Israel, from Canada to the US to Portugal to the Basque country. Plants, he writes, have accompanied his life in every context, and it has comforted him to think that even after he left a particular place the trees and plants he loved remained behind and continued to flourish. Like Irigaray, Marder found a refuge in vegetal being, but his account attests to a strong desire not only to escape to nature but also to forge an intimate relationship with it. He argues that the plant/vegetal world should not primarily be thought of as something for humans, a stance that would render it part of the human tradition that seeks to master and domesticate nature for its own use, but rather as itself autonomous.

In 2012 Marder published an opinion piece in the New York Times entitled "If Peas Can Talk, Should We Eat Them?" In addition to heralding an area of philosophical plant studies that would flourish when he eventually published his plant philosophy with an academic press, the piece set off a torrent of vitriolic and derisive commentary from many angles. Marder couches the toxic response to his essay in terms of an analysis of the current historical context, when the "deadly and nihilistic energy that our culture tends to unleash against life ricocheted in my direction" (123). The angriest reactions to his piece drew the seemingly absurd conclusion that phytophilia is tantamount to either misanthropy or hatred of animals (166). It is astounding to think that such a gentle account could give rise to such vehement opposition.

Marder's section, like Irigaray's but to an even greater extent, marries personal reminiscence with broad philosophical critique. Marder, too, suggests that an authentic encounter with the multiple life forms represented by plants (but not excluding animals and humans), is life affirming in a way that can combat nihilism. Vegetal being again stands in for life, although Marder is careful to insist that there can be no metaphysical singular universal "Life". The latter locution, in his words, "formalizes and distances life from its natural forms, turning it into DNA or the 'life of the mind'" (120), an example of the kind of loose and quick conclusion that recurs frequently in this book. Marder posits that vegetal life is at the origin of all living, and that the phenomenon of plant germination may be behind both natural and cultural happening. If this is true, he suggests, then our relationship to our own birth, rather than a traumatic break with what or who gave us life, as psychoanalysis and philosophy would have it, could be reconceptualized as "a continuous appearing, forever indebted before and relying on its 'soil'" (170). The other to whom we are indebted would be vegetal being.

The reason that vegetation is a figure for life (leaving Aristotle aside), never explicitly argued by Irigaray or Marder, is because plants provide oxygen for us; we cannot breathe without them. This crucial function has been overlooked. As Marder writes:

the European construction of spirit is grounded on [the] neglect of the breathing surface of the body and of plant respiration. Modern humanity has unlearned the rules of sharing . . . and has appropriated much more than it has given back. . . . It has taken its own breath away (132).

This somewhat heavy-handed shifting back and forth between the literal life-giving qualities of vegetation and plant metaphors that critique contemporary culture characterizes much of the book and calls into question its audience. Both Irigaray and Marder make quick references that only philosophers might catch, but in ways that are not precise enough to satisfy the philosopher's desire for an argument.

For example, both thinkers refer implicitly to Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit. Irigaray's claim that life is a sphere that "precedes the master/slave conflict" nods to Hegel's account of the emergence of self-consciousness (and is closer to his text, where Life is the "differenceless fluid medium")[4], while Marder posits that an encounter with nature can return one to "a state before 'sense-certainty,'" that is to say, to the "indeterminacy of existence before it lends itself to self-assured judgments and interpretations" (179). Setting aside the very different moments of experience these passages recount in Hegel, such comments are too quickly asserted and not developed. Unlike Hegel, who saw life as the unity that maintains itself through its self-differentiation, including its development into spirit, both Irigaray and Marder draw a too-neat and arguably false opposition between theorization and life (214), sometimes seeming to imply that communing with nature in itself constitutes a philosophical resistance to the formalization of thought. Whole philosophical systems are rejected in sweeping statements; when Marder writes "In Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit, Spirit (Geist) is at home with itself in the absolute, on the basis of which the entire world will be reconstructed despite the disquietude of self-negating thought" (149), the reader might miss the more nuanced account of Hegel's philosophy of nature we find in Marder's other writings.

Marder is at his best here when he is autobiographical (as he also was in the gorgeous Chernobyl Herbarium[5]) and reflective. Marder's suggestion that being with plants and animals is a togetherness that precedes sociality is philosophically undeveloped, but poetically forms part of a lovely passage on walking through the woods and catching sight of a figure that may or may not be a human being ahead. In a kind of intersubjective version of Descartes' doubt that his body is his own, the ambiguity of the situation in the woods leads Marder to imagine that what he sees obscurely ahead of him may be not a person at all but a robot; it is foggy and he cannot discern it clearly. Yet, he asks, why would a robot stroll in the woods? (180) To go into the woods alone and to encounter an other in the woods are the activities of a living being, not a robot.

This observation strikes the reader as true; however, in continuing, Marder asks: "could it be that we are least robotlike when we encounter the natural world and meet other humans there?" (183) It is in the occasional somewhat clunky critique of technologized life and the implication that nature is an untouched sphere to be judged against the "robotlike" that Marder and Irigaray draw closest to each other.

The conclusions of this book ultimately dissatisfy, despite the occasional lovely moment. It is not that contemporary humans do not go into nature; in fact, they do so all the time, whether while jogging, gardening, or taking a vacation to a national park. Even the corporate hero who works 60-hour weeks eventually books a vacation in the wilderness to reboot and rejuvenate. Rather, the problem lies with thinking of nature as that which is merely for the subject. Adorno critiqued the view that sees nature as a healing antithesis to society, indicating with the term "natural beauty" nature in its nonidentity with our subjective grasp of it. Specifying nature as the antithesis of and a respite from instrumental reason, Adorno noted, immediately and paradoxically co-opts it to the sphere of what it intends to oppose, in the form of the leisure industry, the aesthetic appreciation of nature, and the care of nature as a care of the self, just as vegetable energy is coopted into animal consumption.[6] Marder's discomfort with some of Irigaray's language of nature as a refuge from the logos, I think, reflects its tendency to identify nature only in its relation to the human.

This is an intimate encounter between two formidable thinkers, but strikes the reader almost like a private email exchange. Such exchanges can be revelatory, but also closed off in the sense that they don't provide the rich context necessary for those not in on the background of the conversation to gain insight into the problems they explore. I welcome the publication of Irigaray's fully developed plant philosophy to complement the plant thinking Marder has already shared with the reading public.

[1]Michael Marder, Plant Thinking (Columbia University Press, 2013), 9.

[2]Marder 2013, xii.

[3]The concept of air, which recalls Irigaray's The Forgetting of Air in Martin Heidegger (University of Texas Press, 1999), is decidedly more naturalized here than her earlier account.

[4]G.W.F. Hegel, Phenomenology of Spirit, trans. A.V. Miller (Oxford University Press, 1977, 108.

[5]Michael Marder and Anaïs Tondeur, The Chernobyl Herbarium (Open Humanities Press, 2016).

[6] Theodor Adorno, Aesthetic Theory, trans. Robert Hullot-Kentor (University of Minnesota Press, 1998), 69.