Thucydides and the Philosophical Origins of History

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Darien Shanske, Thucydides and the Philosophical Origins of History, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 280pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521864119.

Reviewed by Joshua J. Reynolds, Colgate University


The question of philosophy in Thucydides is not without precedent.  Granted, in 1929 Cochrane offered a plausible picture of a Thucydides whose work was scientific and prognostic rather than philosophical.  One of his main reasons was that the History does not address unverifiable questions such as "what constitutes progress and decline in general, how do these come about, and how may they be measured?"[1]  Cochrane did, however, become a whipping boy for subsequent generations, as scholars rightly began to emphasize Thucydides' intense interest in the general principles of human life and the very questions that Cochrane failed to recognize.[2]  Collingwood's study of the philosophical nature and aims of Greek historiography perhaps marks the beginning of this tradition.[3]  A few other examples should suffice.  Hans-Peter Stahl aimed to show that the History is not supposed to be prognostic and utilitarian, but rather offers general insight into the fallibility of human planning and the suffering that can result from it.[4]  In the following decade, Virginia Hunter argued that Thucydides would not have considered his text "useful" unless it were grounded in a general theory that gave meaning to the narrative of particular facts.[5]  Similarly, Pouncey's thesis was that Thucydides explains specific historical events in terms of a wider system of thought about human nature.[6]  More recently, Lisa Kallet-Marx has shown that Thucydides' analysis of pre-history in the Archaeology conveys his general theory of the nature of power; while Robert Luginbill has maintained that Thucydides' assumption of regularity in human nature does not mean that history is predictable, but that historical processes are determined by certain irrational patterns of human behavior.[7]

Like most modern scholarship on Thucydides, Shanske's recent book defends the idea that the narrative of events in the History is built on a framework of general assumptions about human nature and political power.  Shanske's book is distinctive, however, in that it is devoted exclusively to uncovering these assumptions and attempts to present them as a coherent metaphysical position, which has roots in Heraclitus, parallels in Attic tragedy, and an outright philosophical rival in Platonism.  Along the way, Shanske situates his discussion within the "larger philosophical problematic" (13) of the views of modern philosophers such as Nietzsche, Heidegger, Wittgenstein, and Hegel.

The author's main argument is that Thucydides' text has succeeded in attracting so many readers due to its relationship with tragedy and the metaphysics of Heraclitus.  Shanske begins in his introduction by reviewing Thucydides' account in book eight of the revolt of Chios from Athens.  He defines his primary task as "to demonstrate what is remarkable in this passage, including our acceptance of it as unremarkable" (2).  The author explains that we cannot see what is remarkable about it because we have already been drawn into the world that Thucydides' text creates by the time that we encounter the passage.  As an illustration of this process of familiarization, the author compares Thucydides' text to a "fly-bottle," following an image of Wittgenstein, and explains that by the time we have completed book one we already "live in" that bottle (2-3).  Shanske then goes on to define his purpose in terms of this fly-bottle: he aims "to show that we are in a fly-bottle, to outline its contours, and, most importantly, to analyze how we have arrived within it" (3).

Shanske makes free use of specialized terminology throughout his book.  He therefore proceeds in the second half of his introduction to offer some definitions.  This is helpful, as he will go on to restate his purpose in terms of such terminology.  Shanske says that he aims to answer the following question: "How does Thucydides's text possess the world-disclosive power required to found a world?"  His definitions are as follows: he uses "'disclose' as the verb for what Thucydides does for those who enter his fly-bottle, 'world' for the space in the fly-bottle in which we find ourselves, and 'found' for when the world that has been disclosed has proven so resilient and expansive that it has comfortably absorbed generation after generation of readers" (8-9).

This reader would have preferred a less metaphorical statement of purpose.  To define unusual and ambiguous terminology in terms of an already obscure metaphor is not exactly informative.  Another example of the author's tendency towards obscurity is his definition of 'metaphysical':

The new world disclosed by Thucydides's text is not a physical world.  Rather, in this context, a world is a boundless sphere of significant engagement.  The "world of the theater" captures the sense I am aiming at, but only for someone who lives in that world (9).

Shanske goes on to explain that outsiders to the world of the theater would see the backstage activities as strange, while an actor would fail to notice this strangeness.  One confusion here resides in the clause "but only for someone who lives in that world."  On a first run-through, one might think that this clause modifies the verb 'captures'.  But then this would mean that only those who live in the world of the theater can understand what Shanske is saying about the term 'metaphysical'.  This cannot be right.  So despite its position in the sentence, the clause probably should be taken with the subject "the world of the theater."  What Shanske seems to be saying is that Thucydides' text discloses a metaphysical world, where this world is essentially similar to the world of the theater for someone who lives in that world, that is, familiar to actors and strange to the audience.  But if this is right, then why would Shanske call such a world "metaphysical?"  Is it that a production of a play is a mere physical reality to the audience in that they do not grasp what happens behind the scenes to produce the overall spectacle that they are witnessing?  Does Thucydides' text train the reader, as it were, to apply make-up, to change costumes, to locate the trap door, and to operate the lights -- realities all of which lie beyond the audience's perceptions, and yet are jointly responsible for creating the overall spectacle?  But if this is right, then Thucydides' text must also disclose a physical world, as we surely must know the scenes in order to appreciate what goes on behind them.  Moreover, does any text disclose only a physical world?  Aren't the worlds of Homer, Hesiod, Herodotus, and Plato metaphysical in the relevant way?  And how does the theater comparison shed light on Shanske's first attempt to define 'metaphysical' as "a boundless sphere of significant engagement"?  What is boundless about the behind-the-scenes world of the theater?  Perhaps there is something boundless about it; but whatever it is, it is not obvious.  Shanske needs to be more explicit.

Shanske's aim in chapter one is to explore the reader's first steps into Thucydides' fly-bottle.  To this end, he begins by considering six features of the text so that we will "know when we have entered" it (15).  A key feature is familiarity.  Shanske argues that the Archaeology, from its opening sentence, exhibits a polemical approach to previous authors, which is "an integral part of creating [Thucydides'] new world as one that is both familiar and strikingly different" (26).  Another way of engendering familiarity is Thucydides' appeal to the notion of logos, which the author defines as "world-ordering" (10).  Shanske points out that logos in all its forms was at the heart of Athenian history and life, such as public discourse, tribal organization, the Athenian navy, currency, the empire, and Pericles' praise of Athens through logos.  He concludes that Thucydides' medium "had to be logos, and not just logos in general, but a logos dense with isomorphism and self-reference (including performative elements), a carefully ordered and expansive logos -- a logos, in short, adequate to the task of clearly presenting the empire of logos, a space where an Athenian reader would quickly be at home" (31).

One of Shanske's more interesting discussions deals with the notion of "aspect seeing."  He argues that when Thucydides states his goal as clarity (to saphes) he does not refer to the process of "producing, or attempting to produce, a single transparent account of events" (33).  Instead, Thucydides is concerned with "aspect seeing," which Shanske identifies as "the phenomenological core of world disclosure precisely because it explains how it is possible, with a certain kind of training, for some people, at certain times, to see connections that they could not see before -- even though there has not necessarily been a physical change in any sense …" (34).  He adds that it is a "seeing that goes beyond mere appearance" (35-36).  Shanske seems to be right here.  But he needs to say more about the relevance of Thucydides' particular concern with this type of seeing.  For one thing, "aspect seeing" is not unique to Thucydides, as Shanske himself acknowledges.  All throughout Greek literature one finds the distinction between seeing some object or state of affairs directly and understanding its hidden significance, whether causal processes, underlying structure, governing patterns, essences, true value, or the like.  How exactly does "aspect seeing" serve to explain the distinctive power of Thucydides' text when the standard model of sight throughout Greek literature just is the ability to grasp hidden realities behind the appearances?

Chapter two considers Pericles and his speeches "[t]o illustrate the worldliness of the world that Thucydides discloses" (41).  Shanske begins by reviewing some of the themes of these speeches, such as Pericles' own ethos and the consistency of his gnome, the power of eros, action at the right moment (kairos), and praise of Athenian national character.  The remainder of the chapter explores the reception of these topoi in speeches that other speakers deliver, such as Cleon and Diodotus, Brasidas and Hermocrates, and Nicias and Alcibiades.  In fact, these topoi turn up even before Pericles' arrival, in Thucydides' account of Themistocles and in his own analysis of naval power in the Archaeology.  Shanske observes that given the appearance of Periclean topoi in these other contexts, "the constancy and unity of Pericles seem to disappear" (65).  He concludes that there is no one way to read Pericles and that his figure is caught in "an odd textual-temporal loop," since his characteristic claims "are embedded in the prehistory of the Greeks, as well as their history long after he leaves the scene" (62).  The upshot of this "peculiar temporality," the author notes, is that it serves to explain the "disclosive power" of the History (65).  Shanske returns to this topic in the final chapter.

The third chapter asks what is tragic about the History.  In particular, Shanske focuses on what he takes to be "the center of the tragic condition," the deinon, or "the dreadable" (69).  This notion, he argues, comprises continuity between Thucydides and tragedy, and thereby serves as the crucial means of seducing the reader into the text.  Shanske's main point is that "tragedy is a dramatization of the deinon in action -- namely, of self-exceeding disasters that are intimately bound up with logos" (71).  He explains that the deinon is what threatens to begin a chain of unending disasters due to the human tendency to push too far beyond boundaries.  In tragedy, logos is most dreadable in human beings because we must use it, and yet we can never fully control it (72).  Accordingly, as Shanske observes, what is most dreadable about logos is time; it cannot be limited temporally any more than the lessons of tragedy can be bounded by the stage, circumstances of performance, or dramatic ending (ibid.).  Shanske goes on to identify the elements of the deinon and its relation with logos in Thucydides' stories of Harmodius and Aristogeiton and the civil war at Corcyra.  He concludes that for Thucydides epieikeia ("equity," "leniency") is "that which harnesses the deinon in order to maintain the polis against the deinon power of competition" (111), and that "it is epieikeia that … has the ability to save the polis and the community of poleis from the vicious cycles of the deinon" (114).

The fourth and final chapter explores the meaning of the phrase "tragic temporality" as the author uses it to explain what is so alluring about Thucydides' text.  He defines tragic temporality as "constituted by engagement with the convoluted issues that have no particular place in the ordinary successive time delineated by the ticking of a clock" (124).  In contrasting the "organizing temporality" (120) of Pericles' Funeral Oration with that of Plato's Menexenus, Shanske, following Nietzsche, concludes that Thucydides offers "a cure for Platonism."  He explains:

The riddle of how Thucydides founds a world is entangled with this philosophical debate [between Nietzsche and Heidegger on Thucydides as a cure for Platonism] because it is only on account of a powerful, correct, and non-Platonic Thucydidean insight into the structure of the world that he succeeds in founding a world rather than merely disclosing one.  In other words, Thucydides founds a world because the harsh reductionism of his method reveals essential features of our world as it is, though these true features are not mechanical laws of history, nor can they generally be explained by any logical superstructure (132-33).

Shanske goes on to point out that the Platonic model privileges deduction, while Thucydides privileges abduction, that is, "the repeating self-referential structure through which science is actually done," in which one constantly modifies one's general premises on the basis of conclusions that those premises make possible (141-42).  Thucydides founds a world, the author explains, "because his world performs tragic temporality and allows those who wish to see clearly to abduct their way to wisdom" (142).  The practical difference between Thucydides and Plato "is not whether there is a place for policy intervention, or even what the justification for such an intervention might be, but what is the ongoing attitude toward the intervention" (145).  The author concludes:

In a Heraclitean world, no solution is ever stable because there is no bedrock, and a sustained, though inherently messy, tension … is not just acceptable, but about as desirable an outcome as is imaginable.  For a Platonist, such an outcome is testament to the failure of the underlying conception … What the wise can see in Thucydides's History is not directly oriented towards its usefulness, but is mediated through grasping a clarity.  This does not make the work useless, nor can its purpose only be recouped as a kind of cognitive or conceptual practice (145).

Shanske closes the book with four appendices: "Restoring Key Terms 1.1-1.23" ('unconcealedness', 'what is appropriate', 'pre-text', 'compulsion', 'kind'); "Pretragic History of Deinon"; "Wittgenstein on fly-bottles, Aspect Seeing, and History"; and "Heidegger on World and Originary Temporality."

Shanske's study is certainly unique and interesting.  Many of his observations are not new; but his contribution is the particular way that he draws together and builds upon pre-existing views.[8]  There is genuine insight here and on the whole the book helps the reader to appreciate Thucydides' philosophical accomplishment.  But to be critical: the author's discussions tend to be idiosyncratic and impenetrable.  The main problem is his widespread use of unusual jargon and forms of expression, obscure metaphors, and equivocation.  This constantly forces the reader to try to interpret the interpreter.  Moreover, the discussion tends to proceed as a stream of consciousness, disregarding the need for argumentation, engagement with the Greek texts, and critical assessment of secondary literature.  In short, the book is more a work of philosophical reflection than a careful philological study.

[1] C. N. Cochrane, Thucydides and the Science of History (London: Oxford University Press, 1929), 32-33.

[2] See, however, de Ste. Croix, who contends that criticism of Cochrane had gone too far; G. E. M. de Ste. Croix, The Origins of the Peloponnesian War (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1972), 29-33.

[3] R. G. Collingwood, The Idea of History (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1961).

[4] H.-P. Stahl, Thukydides: Die Stellung des Menschen im geschichtlichen Prozess (Munich: Beck, 1966).

[5] V. Hunter, Thucydides the Artful Reporter (Toronto: Hakkert, 1973).

[6] P. R. Pouncey, The Necessities of War: A Study of Thucydides' Pessimism (New York: Columbia University Press, 1980).

[7] L. Kallet-Marx, Money, Expense, and Naval Power in Thucydides' History 1 5.24 (Berkeley: University of California Press, 1993). R. D. Luginbill, Thucydides on War and National Character (Boulder: Westview Press, 1999).  For a useful recent overview of Thucydides as "philosophic historian," see P. Zagorin, Thucydides: An Introduction for the Common Reader (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 2005), 139­-­83.

[8] Shanske himself would perhaps admit this: "Given the intensity of academic specialization, such piecemeal incorporation is inevitable and is often very fruitful.  Chapters 1 through 3, for instance, often rely on the textual analysis of others, just as Chapter 4 relies on the philosophical arguments of others" (14).