Thus Spoke Zarathustra

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Friedrich Nietzsche, Thus Spoke Zarathustra, Adrian Del Caro (ed., tr.), Robert Pippin (ed.), Cambridge University Press, 2006, 270pp., $17.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521795346.
Friedrich Nietzsche, Thus Spoke Zarathustra, Graham Parkes (tr.), Oxford University Press, 2005, 335pp., $14.95 (pbk), ISBN 0192805835.

Reviewed by Clancy Martin, University of Missouri, Kansas City


Thus Spoke Zarathustra (hereafter TSZ) is a difficult book to translate. With a traditional philosophical text the translator's conscience is driven by accuracy, and when in doubt the translator will be as literal as possible. But that won't work with TSZ. While it is an undeniably philosophical work -- Nietzsche, the most widely influential philosopher of the past two hundred years, considered it his masterpiece -- it is also a work of literature. And you can't translate literature literally and have it work out well. Literature doesn't have only a sense, it also has a sound. That Nietzsche, like Kierkegaard, the German Romantics, and many of the twentieth-century Existentialists, thought philosophy and literature were ultimately inseparable arts only further complicates the translator's task.

It would make things easier for the translator if TSZ were not so astonishingly opaque. My mentor, the late Robert C. Solomon, frequently described TSZ as "the book I almost wish Nietzsche had never written" (and he often left out the "almost"), and many of us will be tempted to agree if only because of the damage the book has done to Nietzsche's reception among professional philosophers. Many smart people get their first real taste of Nietzsche in an attempt to read TSZ and are permanently turned off -- and not only because of the frequently odd style (one should say, styles) of the work. It is so difficult to understand what he is saying that one is tempted to conclude that you simply can't make sense of it at all -- or, still worse, that it doesn't make sense. It does make sense, as many terrific commentators have shown: first Nietzsche himself, in Beyond Good and Evil, and then others like Carl Jung, Laurence Lampert, Kathleen Higgins, Stanley Rosen, Robert Gooding-Williams, and Thomas Seung. But it is such a complex, paradoxical and gnomic book that the translator will often have difficulty knowing whether he has even approximated what Nietzsche meant from one passage to the next. And when you're not sure what is meant, it is hard to feel confident that you've conveyed the meaning.

Another problem with translating TSZ -- perhaps the thorniest of all -- is that Nietzsche imitates so many different kinds of writing in the book. As a philologist and nineteenth-century German, he is often classical: sometimes Thucydidean, sometimes Platonic, sometimes satirical after Juvenal or Perseus, sometimes as clear, precise and methodical as Aristotle. As a minister's son and a parodist and opponent of Christianity his style is often biblical, and specifically Lutheran. And, finally, as German's greatest stylist yet, he is innovative and above all modern: modern in the sense that we more commonly associate with French and English writers in the early twentieth century. Nietzsche was one of the inventors of the style of writing that insists upon the tones of ordinary speech and intelligent conversation. But to translate all of this into English requires -- well, if not an English speaking Nietzsche, at least an extraordinary amount of work, and perhaps an original literary talent. Despite the fact that there are now seven translations of Also sprach Zarathustra into English (Tille, Common, Kaufmann, Hollingdale, Martin, Del Caro, Parkes), it may well be that Nietzsche has not yet found his English translator.

Three of the English translations I have just listed appeared in the past few years: the two I am reviewing here -- one by Adrian Del Caro for Cambridge and the other by Graham Parkes for Oxford -- and (complete disclosure) my own translation (published in 2004 by Barnes and Noble Classics). To the best of my knowledge, and unfortunately, there was little if any cooperation among the translators. But simultaneous competing translations of a book, conducted by translators in ignorance of one another's work, is part of publishing today, and is also evidence, in this particular case, of the size and spread of contemporary Nietzsche scholarship.

With the exception of Tille and his revision by Common, all of the translations are good for the general reader. The translations reviewed here are the ones for the specialist to use: as a community we Nietzsche scholars should finally give up Kaufmann, now -- we all owe him a debt, but he's had his turn, and it is time for us to follow the accurate punctuation and paragraphing of Nietzsche's text -- and use either Parkes or Del Caro. The Parkes translation was done for the Oxford World's Classics series and is intended for both the general and the academic audience. The Del Caro translation, edited by Robert Pippin and Adrian Del Caro, is in the Cambridge Texts in the History of Philosophy series, and therefore is intended for students and scholars. Accordingly, the Parkes translation is perfectly appropriate for undergraduate classes, and the Del Caro translation might be a more natural choice for graduate seminars. Parkes' opening essay is an excellent introduction to TSZ, and I recommend it to interested readers and specialists alike. Robert Pippin's essay at the beginning of the Del Caro translation is one of the nicest short pieces he has written about Nietzsche, and is in fact one of the best essays that has been written about TSZ, period. One reads the essay and wishes it were three times as long as it is. That is a very unusual experience in reading essays about TSZ.

The translations have many things in common. In fact it is difficult to find significant differences between them. Both Parkes and Del Caro decided to follow Nietzsche's paragraph structure and punctuation as closely as possible, and I think this was mostly a good decision. Perhaps Kaufmann's single most controversial decision as a translator was his radical alteration of Nietzsche's punctuation (Hollingdale is much more faithful). Kaufmann accomplished what he wanted to in his changing of Nietzsche's punctuation and paragraphing: he made TSZ more readable. But in many places he changed the meaning or emphasis of the text, at least slightly, in doing so. Del Caro is not as strict about following Nietzsche's punctuation as Parkes is, and for this reason -- and some others, which I will get to in a moment -- I found the Del Caro translation at times to be more natural in English and yet less graceful than the Parkes translation. So, for example, Parkes writes: "These young hearts have already become old -- and not even old! only weary, common, comfortable: -- they call it 'we have become pious again'"(155), which is exactly what Nietzsche writes. Del Caro translates the same passage as: "All these young hearts have already grown old -- and not even old! Only weary, common, comfortable -- as they put it: "We have become pious again""(142). The Del Caro punctuation is more familiar English punctuation, but to my ear, at least, it is nicer the way Parkes does it, and his has the added virtue of following the way Nietzsche does it.

While the reader has both of those short passages fresh in his mind, it is worth remarking how similar they are -- and, if you take the trouble to go look, you will see they are also quite close to Kaufmann. In any new translation part of the problem is finding new formulations of already translated (and in both Kaufmann's and Hollingdale's cases, mostly well-translated) lines. Kaufmann and Hollingdale -- and through them, Common, too -- exert a strong influence on both of these translations which, in my opinion, is a good thing. Some translations go astray by trying too hard to find a novel word or phrase, and wind up harming themselves. Neither Del Caro nor Parkes have this problem. To confirm this view, the reader need only read the first page of Kaufmann or Hollingdale and then read the first page of Del Caro or Parkes: they are all strikingly similar, and all very nicely done. Del Caro tends to lean a bit closer to Kaufmann than Parkes: Del Caro chooses the familiar "overman," for example, while Parkes takes a risk and goes with the clumsier but more accurate "overhuman." Strictly speaking it should probably be "superhuman," which, however, would be clumsiest of all. When I translated that word, Robert C. Solomon, and Kathleen Higgins (my co-editors) and I collectively decided to chicken out, and I left it untranslated, writing "Übermensch," and adding a note. Hard to say which is best -- the travails of the translator.

As the Parkes and the Del Caro translations are equally and almost faultlessly accurate, choosing between the two is really a matter of personal taste. For me, the Del Caro reads more easily, but is less interesting, less sparkling. The Parkes hits both more highs and more off-key notes. Parkes seems to have put more of himself into the book.

The Parkes translation strikes me as somewhat more self-consciously literary in its aspirations, and in that way it is perhaps closer to Nietzsche's tone. He says that it is his aim to preserve the "musicality" (xxxv) of TSZ. But in places he sounds forced, and stumbles over bad lines like this one: "A more evil thing you have done to me than any murder is; something irretrievable”(96). Parkes explains in his note on the translation that, following Nietzsche and the Lutheran Bible, he is using an unusual amount of inversion, but sometimes it is a bit too much (at least, for my ear). Because inversion is much more natural in German than it is in English, I think Parkes sometimes makes TSZ sound a bit affected or silly, more affected or silly than even its unsympathetic critics would claim it is if they read it in German. Parkes uses a lot of "whither"s and "verily"s and gamely tries to be faithful to the often exaggeratedly biblical language Nietzsche employed in TSZ. But again, through being too faithful to Nietzsche's language in a somewhat literally-minded way he occasionally does TSZ a disservice. One might say that the Parkes translation shows many of Nietzsche's stylistic strengths and weaknesses -- or one might go a bit further, and say it makes the weaknesses even worse.

But Parkes also hits on many beautiful lines. Saying that Zarathustra lies down "in the stillness and secrecy of the colorful grasses" (240), for example, is just lovely.

In fact, both translations are full of lovely lines. Here's a splendid bit of translation from Del Caro:

Up there I guarded his coffins; the musty vaults stood full of such symbols of conquest. From glass coffins, conquered life looked out at me. / I breathed the odor of eternities turned to dust; my soul lay clammy and dusty, and who could have aired his soul in such a place! (106).

He follows it up, however, with the archaic and ugly expression "my three lady friends” (107).  Lady friends?!

One very good reason to buy the Parkes translation is the endnotes which though not especially long -- there are about thirty pages of them -- are uniformly helpful and excellent. Parkes is particularly good at pointing out the many biblical references in the text. He also highlights important details about the Colli-Montinari text, where relevant. The Del Caro translation has a handful of footnote, in the body of the text, and while good, they are few and far between. I think this is a real defect of the Del Caro translation, and I hope that Cambridge will correct it in subsequent editions of the book. Having a few notes was fine for Kaufmann and Hollingdale, who were in large part introducing Nietzsche to their audiences, but you just can't have a good current translation of TSZ -- especially in a scholarly series -- that does not provide detailed notes.

In closing, I recommend both translations to the English reader. One or the other should supplant Kaufmann as the standard text. I won't venture a guess as to which one it will be. But I'd like to vote for Parkes, even with his weaknesses, because somehow it feels like the translation Nietzsche would have preferred.