Time and Freedom

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Christophe Bouton, Time and Freedom, Christopher McCann (tr.), Northwestern University Press, 2014, 282pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780810130159.

Reviewed by Hans Pedersen, Indiana University of Pennsylvania


In this book Christophe Bouton attempts to explore the connection between human freedom and time. In particular, he is interested in the way different philosophical conceptions of time allow or fail to allow for the existence of alternate possible courses of action. As he states in the Introduction, "I assume that human freedom exists as a choice between several possibilities, and I try to investigate the conception of time which is involved in that notion of freedom" (13-14). His approach is historical insofar as he starts with a consideration of Leibniz's account of time and the necessity of future events, and proceeds in roughly chronological order through other major philosophical figures before ending with a discussion of Levinas. Bouton, however, is not just interested in explaining what some major figures in the canon have to say about the connection between time and freedom. As the work unfolds, it becomes clear that Bouton has selected certain thinkers as representatives of various important stances on this connection and sees the possibility of reaching some general conclusions about the relation of time to freedom through the juxtaposition of these specific stances.

In the following discussion, I am out of necessity simplifying Bouton's account and leaving out consideration of many interesting specific points in favor of providing an outline of the overall thrust of the volume. Part 1 "The Tree of Possibilities," includes chapters on Leibniz, Kant, and Schopenhauer. In the Leibniz chapter, "Whether the Future is Necessary," Bouton essentially lays out the main problem that concerns him. When working within the Leibnizian perspective, there are multiple reasons to worry that all future events are necessary, leaving no room for human agents to choose between possible courses of action: divine foreknowledge, the necessity of the future unfolding in accordance with the principle of sufficient reason, the logical problem of the truth value of statements regarding future events, and Leibniz's belief that a subject always already contains all predicates that will apply to it. Leibniz is then committed to maintaining that all future events and actions are necessary, but also holds that there is still the logical possibility that things could have unfolded differently if God had chosen to structure the world differently. For Leibniz, the "tree of possibilities" really consists of one trunk, with any branches into different future states remaining only hypothetical.

For Kant and Schopenhauer, the problem of the necessity of the future persists, but it takes on a different form as the focus shifts to the determination of future events by physical, causal laws, since the principle of sufficient reason comes to be interpreted in causal terms. Kant's well-known solution is to locate human freedom in the noumenal realm, outside the strictures of the natural causal order. In effect, he agrees with Leibniz that there is but one trunk on the tree of possibilities at the phenomenal level, but human freedom is not confined to this. Bouton points out the well-known problem for Kant's solution: it is difficult to see how noumenal freedom is supposed to translate to any sort of meaningful freedom at the phenomenal level. Bouton then turns to Schopenhauer as a spokesman for the rejection of the Kantian solution and a return to the acceptance of the pre-determination of all future human actions.

Part 2, "The Plasticity of Time," includes chapters on Schelling, Kierkegaard, and Heidegger. The common theme Bouton picks out here is that for all three thinkers, time is now conceived of as mutable or plastic. Time is given its structure of past, present, and future in a moment of decision. For Schelling, Bouton locates the fundamental moment of decision at the divine level. Schelling understands God in terms of two forces: one contractive (egoism) and one expansive (love) (98). The moment that the expansive force prevails over the contractive force, existence and time arise. That moment creates a present, which then defines what came before it as past and what comes after it as future.

There is, of course, a strong religious component to Kierkegaard's views of the moment of decision as well, but Kierkegaard ties this transformative moment more closely to the experience of the individual. Kierkegaard thinks of the decisive moment as the moment of religious conversion, the "transition from untruth to truth" (136). This transformation is only possible through the grace of God, and thus is not something that the individual can bring about herself, but this moment structures the individual's temporality in a way that parallels the sort of cosmic temporal structuring of Schelling. The moment of transformation of the individual makes everything prior to that moment the past and everything ahead of it the future.

Heidegger's account is similar. In Heidegger's early work, the focus is on the moment of decision of the individual agent, while in his later work, he moves closer to Schelling and shifts to thinking of the moment of decision as something that occurs at the level of being itself. For all three thinkers, the time of successive "nows," which is presupposed by both those who worry about the logical necessity of future events (Leibniz) and those who worry about the causal necessity of future events (Kant and Schopenhauer), is seen as derivative, only made possible by the fundamental time structured by the moment of decision. Now, human beings, insofar as we experience or enact these moment of decision, are not locked into a necessary sequence of future events. Bouton sees in these thinkers the possibility of a future that is plastic and indeterminable, allowing for many different branches in the tree of possibilities, and thereby creating a space for freedom.

In the book's final section, "The Mystery of the Future," Bouton seeks to push further down this path of finding an understanding of time that conceives of the future as fundamentally indeterminable. To do this, he turns to Bergson, Sartre, and Levinas. I confess to being somewhat baffled by the Bergson chapter, both in terms of its content and its placement in this section. Bouton clearly wants to focus on Bergson's conception of time as duration as an alternative to thinking of time as successive "nows," which would seem to place Bergson in the category of the thinkers discussed above insofar as duration would provide a way of thinking of the time of physical causality as derivative. I am not sure, though, that I grasp Bouton's argument for considering Bergson as more similar to Sartre or Levinas, both of whom make the case for a radical break between present and future that seems to go beyond anything in Bergson. In any case, Bouton outlines Sartre's reasons for conceiving consciousness as the "power of producing nothingness" (211). If this is the case, then consciousness always has the ability to create a break from any past sequences of causes that might determine its actions or from any future course of action that is thought to be necessary.

Levinas, in working out his views in contrast to those of Heidegger, sees a persistent focus on the individual subject in Heidegger's early thought, a focus that leads Heidegger to conceive of the future, and consequently the past and present, in terms of the projects of the subject. For Levinas, "It is the other in its absolute alterity that unfolds temporality according to its three dimensions, and first of all that of the future" (235). This means that the future is always beyond the grasp of the subject in the present; it is an absolutely open, indeterminable realm of different possibilities. We can see now why Bouton reads Sartre and Levinas as going further than Schelling, Kierkegaard, and Heidegger in important ways. For the latter three thinkers, there is a sense in which the future is not fixed insofar as the moment of decision can re-structure our temporal experience, but in Bouton's words, the "surging up of the liberating moment looks like an enigmatic deus ex machina" (231). For Sartre and Levinas, there is always a radical separation between the present and the future and a radical indeterminateness of the future, not just special, decisive moments in which the future becomes open and indeterminate.

In a book this ambitious, dealing with so many complicated thinkers and works in such a limited space, there are bound to be more minor interpretive quibbles about specific points than can be dealt with in a short review, so I want to focus my critical remarks on larger issues that pervade the entire volume. One worry with Bouton's project that immediately popped up and never really went away is that he explicitly and exclusively thinks of freedom in terms of the ability to choose between alternate possibilities. For at least the past several decades, there has been an extensive discussion of whether this ability to choose alternate possibilities really is necessary for freedom. If Bouton does feel that freedom is essentially tied to the existence of alternate possibilities, it would seem that he should say something to justify this commitment. To just stipulate that freedom "exists as a choice between several possibilities" (13) in one sentence in the Introduction without further comment seems an overly hasty way to set the foundation for the whole enterprise.

This leads to a further, related worry. By the end of the book, Bouton takes himself to have shown how we can think of the future as completely indeterminate, and thus human action as completely free. "In the domain of human actions," he claims, "the future remains contingent and undetermined" (251). Again, he fails to engage with anything in the large body of literature discussing the problems of thoroughgoing indeterminism. The main problem, as is often pointed out, is that by embracing the sort of radical indeterminacy Bouton finds in Sartre and Levinas, one seems to rule out any possibility for the agent to exert control of her actions. In this scenario, the outcome of our actions would be random and indeterminate, and it is often thought that this either is not really freedom or is a rather unattractive type of freedom. Bouton does allude to this problem in the Sartre chapter in which he states:

To the partisans of determinism, Sartre agrees that every action has a motive, a reason, as well as an intention . . . But the error of the determinists is to consider that the motive is the cause of the acts. The motive never suffices to explain the act. (215)

However, Bouton does not clarify what exactly does suffice to explain the act. Is there some form of agent causation invoked here or just pure indeterminacy? It might be the case that Bouton is willing to "bite the bullet" and accept that the sort of freedom he ends up with does not allow for agential control over actions. He might even want to argue that this sort of freedom is worthwhile or at least the best we can hope for, but he does not clearly state his position on this anywhere in the text. If he cannot make the case that freedom must be connected to the ability to choose alternate possibilities and requires a strong form of indeterminacy, Bouton's project begins to appear a bit tangential to the central questions surrounding human freedom.

Throughout the book, in fact, there is very limited engagement with any secondary literature. Bouton does an admirable job of bringing less-discussed texts from the major thinkers into his argument. For instance, he spends a good deal of time discussing the pre- and post-Critical works of Kant, and a large portion of the Heidegger chapter is devoted to the Fundamental Concepts of Metaphysics lecture course. However, he makes very infrequent use of scholarly work on the figures he is interpreting. For the figures with whom I am more familiar, I found instances where referencing relevant debates in the secondary literature could have helped Bouton clarify his point or could have let the reader know that he is advancing a somewhat unorthodox reading (his interpretation of Heidegger's views on death fits on both of these counts). For other thinkers with whom I am less familiar (e.g., Leibniz), I found myself wondering where his interpretation fit with mainstream scholarly interpretations. It would have been nice in these instances to have some sense of whether Bouton is merely rehearsing the standard interpretation or is proposing a somewhat novel reading.

Finally, I should note that I found the chapters to be uneven in terms of quality and clarity. In several chapters, I felt that Bouton leaned too much on the jargon of the thinker under discussion, leaving a reader who lacks extensive background in that thinker unable to engage with the argument. For instance, in the chapter on Bergson, we find claims like, "the more duration is intense, the more it is capable of engendering free actions" (201). I admit to not understanding what it would mean for duration to be more or less intense, and Bouton provides little help here. Similarly, in the Heidegger chapter, we find claims such as, "To my death, the possibility and the impossibility of all my possibilities, there corresponds my freedom, which is the possibility of all my possibilities -- the possibilization of possibility" (156). I think I understand what Bouton is getting at here, but this is due more to my previously accrued understanding of Heidegger than to Bouton's explanation, and I cannot imagine someone with a more limited knowledge of Heidegger being able to make sense of that sentence. Alternatively, I found the chapter on Levinas, another philosopher notoriously difficult to explain to non-specialists, to be admirably clear and peppered with concrete examples used to explain some of the more difficult ideas (e.g., the use of parenthood to explain how the future is both connected to us and is generative of possibilities that are beyond our control (243)).

Overall, then, Bouton's book has many insightful, informative facets, both in his interpretation of individual thinkers and his broader consideration of time and freedom, that make it a worthwhile read. There are, however, some overarching issues that prevent me from wholeheartedly endorsing it.


Thanks to my colleague, Eric Rubenstein, for reading and discussing parts of this work with me. His comments were extremely helpful in shaping this review.