Time and History in Deleuze and Serres

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Bernd Herzogenrath (ed.), Time and History in Deleuze and Serres, Continuum, 2012, 256pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441163868.

Reviewed by Jeffrey A. Bell, Southeastern Louisiana University


There has been a trend within recent scholarship on Gilles Deleuze to connect his writings and concepts to themes within both history and the philosophy of time. With respect to the philosophy of time, James Williams has recently published the very nice Gilles Deleuze's Philosophy of Time (Edinburgh University Press, 2011), though there have been a number of other essays and books that rely heavily on a reading of Deleuze's understanding of time, whether this be by way of Bergson (see Keith Ansell-Pearson's Adventures of the Virtual) or Deleuze's Cinema books (see D.N. Rodowick's Gilles Deleuze's Time Machine.) Discussion of a possible philosophy of history within the work of Deleuze has only begun to surface more recently, and understandably so when one considers Deleuze's claims such that "History isn't experimental, it's just the set of more or less negative preconditions that make it possible to experiment with something beyond history" (Negotiations, 1995, 170); or again, in A Thousand Plateaus (1987), when Deleuze and Guattari argue that "History is made by those who oppose history." (295) Coming from a philosopher for whom creativity and experimentation are the most cherished values, this is a damning criticism indeed. It is thus no surprise that Deleuze scholars have tended to steer clear from even considering a possible connection between Deleuze and history, a connection that could be fruitful both to philosophy and to history.

This hesitancy to consider such connections between Deleuze's philosophy and history has begun to subside in a number of recent works. Early on there was Manuel Delanda's Thousand Years of Nonlinear History (1997), which shows how one can adopt Deleuze and Guattari's nonlinear metaphysics to an understanding of history. More recently, there is Jay Lampert's Deleuze and Guattari's Philosophy of History (2006), in which, unlike Delanda's reading, which relies upon an implicit reading of dynamic systems into Deleuze and Guattari, Lampert argues for an explicit philosophy of history within Deleuze and Guattari's writings. There have also been some recent collections of essays to tackle the subject, such as Bell and Colebrook's Deleuze and History (2009). Bernd Herzogenrath's edited volume is an important contribution to this emerging body of literature.

What is unique about this volume is its surprising (to this reader) focus upon the work of Michel Serres. What first comes to mind when one considers connecting Deleuze to time and history are the figures Deleuze himself wrote about -- namely, Bergson, Peguy, and perhaps even Proust. By drawing out the comparisons between Deleuze and Serres, however, this collection of essays is able to track a middle ground relative to previous approaches. Whereas Delanda's finding a philosophy of history in Deleuze and Guattari draws upon a scientific reading that largely overlooks the distinctively philosophical problems Deleuze and Guattari were addressing, Jay Lampert's reading does address the philosophical problems but largely avoids the importance of science and empirical facts for history and historical practice. By turning to the work of Serres, this collection of essays rectifies this situation, and by shining the light on the concept of multiplicity, it does justice to both the philosophical problems that were the central focus of Deleuze's work and also accounts for the conditions of real, empirical facts. As Hanjo Berresem puts it in his essay, by drawing from the concept of multiplicity we are able "to resist two complementary temptations: to dissolve history in historiography and to dissolve historiography in history." (203) In other words, with the concept of multiplicity we can fully appreciate Deleuze's transcendental empiricism and thus avoid reducing the empirical to the transcendental or the transcendental to the empirical.

Key to understanding the importance of the concept 'multiplicity' that is at work in most of the essays in this volume is situating it in contrast to traditional linear understandings of time and history. Following the lead of Brian Massumi, Manuel Delanda, and others, Deleuze has been fruitfully read as one who endorses a metaphysics of non-linear dynamic systems. Understood in this way, and as Elizabeth Grosz points out in her short essay, a Deleuzian (and likewise a Serresian as others will argue) philosophy of time is quite unlike the one put forward by Kant. Rather than time being the pure a priori form of that which comes to pass, Grosz argues that time is not the neutral, passive medium within which a subject experience an objective world. Rather, "time acts, it has its own forces, which cannot be described as either worldly or subjective, for it is the condition of their very opposition." (149) These forces and actions, moreover, are themselves dynamic and non-linear, and hence by their very nature involve multiplicities -- that is, a multiplicity of potential states can be actualized from such non-linear systems and the state that is actualized was not pre-determined from the start. It is for this reason that in his introduction Herzogenrath argues that rather than being predetermined and determining, "the a prioris of time and space are inherently multiplicitous." (14)

Similar arguments are made with respect to history. An historical fact, for instance, is not, as Deleuze and Serres understand it, taken to be an already completed datum that then serves as the ultimate basis upon which historians establish their truths. To the contrary, such facts are themselves constituted multiplicities, or assemblages to use one of Deleuze's terms, and as such these facts forever harbor actualizations within contexts that may be far removed from the linear, chronological date of the event. Serres refers to this phenomenon as the crumpled nature of time and history, and it is a point referred to repeatedly within the essays of this book. If traditional history is based upon facts that are dated in linear, chronological fashion, then the 'crumpled handkerchief' view of history can draw these events close together as the flat handkerchief is crumpled. Which events will be brought together upon such crumpling, and which not, is largely unpredictable and yet inherent in the multiplicitous nature of historical facts. Herzogenrath stresses this point as well in the introduction when he claims a historical fact is a factum that is "made of an infinite number of levels at the same time and that it produces/is produced auto-poietically" (5); and in Jane Bennett and William Connolly's essay, "The Crumpled Handkerchief," they direct the reader to the work of medieval historian Eileen Joy for defending "a model of historiography close to the one Serres recommends," where, citing Joy, "'every present moment is inhabited by and also inhabits (consciously and unconsciously) multiple, heterogeneous temporalities -- some at a distant remove and others more contiguous.'" (166)

The essays in this collection, however, do not always stress the shared concerns between Serres and Deleuze on the multiplicitous nature of reality and its implications for thinking time and history. A number of contrasts are put forth as well. Kelvin Clayton, for example, argues that Serres gives greater "emphasis to the background, to the sea of nothingness from which form emerges," while Deleuze "instead focuses on the process and codification of emergence." (34) Although this may be true as a general point, it is not correct to say that Deleuze does not stress the importance of the background, for he does indeed do so, and in very Serresian terms too when, in Difference and Repetition, he discusses "white noise" and "white light" as the real conditions for determinate sounds and colors (see Difference and Repetition, p. 206). Paul Patton homes in on how Deleuze and Foucault use the term actuality in relationship to history, and he concludes that whereas Foucault understands actuality to be that which is clarified by way of the archaeologies and histories he wrote -- histories that "act upon our experience of the present" (i.e., actuality) as Patton puts it -- Deleuze takes actuality to be that which we are in the process of becoming. For Patton this difference is crucial, and Deleuze is mistaken in reading Foucault's use of the term as the same as his own. A consequence of this difference, Patton argues, is that Foucault, in contrast to Deleuze, is much more open to the effectiveness and power of history, while Deleuze prefers philosophical and conceptual analyses that seek to clarify the nature of the actuality we are becoming.

Finally, though not exhaustively, Nathan Widder challenges a common reading of Deleuze that places Bergson at the center of his mature views on the philosophy of time. As Widder makes the case, and it is a strong one, Deleuze eventually moves beyond Bergson's qualitative/quantitative distinction.  For Bergson, quality (which he values) corresponds to duration and the continuous, while quantity (which he largely disparages, or at least understands as simply derivative from quality and duration) corresponds to analysis and the discontinuous separation and extensive measurement of reality.  Widder claims that Deleuze, after his work on Nietzsche, came to appreciate the importance of intensive quantities and intensive discontinuities. Widder's essay goes a long way in accounting for why Bergson, Peguy, and others are generally given so little attention in a volume of essays dedicated to addressing, among other things, Deleuze's philosophy of time. It would have been helpful if these arguments had been made more explicitly (e.g., in the introduction) and had thereby addressed what some may see as a lacuna in this collection .

Before concluding, it is worth noting a couple essays not yet been mentioned that nevertheless stand out as exceptional contributions. Eugene Holland's, "Non-Linear Historical Materialism," is the lead essay and immediately sets out to address the problem mentioned earlier, namely the lack of politics in Delanda's reading of Deleuze and Guattari's philosophy of history and the lack of attention to non-linear systems in Jay Lampert's reading. The key to bringing a theory of non-linear systems and politics together, Holland argues, is Karl Marx's theory of capital. In short, Holland argues, following Louis Althusser, that "the abstract systematicity captured in the opening chapters of Capital Volume 1" -- namely, the systematic relations of necessity between labor and capital -- are themselves the "result of what Althusser wants to call a 'becoming-necessary' of the encounter evoked in the closing chapters of the same volume." (21) The encounter referred to here is that between laborer and capital in the process of primitive accumulation, which Marx defines, in the closing chapters of Capital Volume 1, as "nothing else than the historical process of divorcing the producer from the means of production. It appears as 'primitive' because it forms the pre-history of capital" (Capital, V. 1, p. 875). It is this pre-history, Holland argues, that needs to be understood in terms of a non-linear history from which the relation between laborer and capital becomes necessary. By bringing to light the "becoming-necessary" of our "enforced dependence on capitalist markets" (29) that is the result of primitive accumulation, Holland argues that what then becomes possible is revolution, whereby this dependence and necessity can become undone.

Claire Colebrook's essay offers a cautionary tale to the trust placed by many of the contributors to this volume in non-linear dynamic systems. As the title of her essay -- "Post-Human Humanities" – suggests,  Colebrook examines the tendency within the humanities to displace the privileged position of the "human" within their analyses. Humans are on an equal, flat ontological (as Levi Bryant and others might put it) footing with every other entity. A dynamical systems approach can be ushered in to support this move to a post-human humanities. As Colebrook puts it, this dynamic systems approach has led to the view where "self-maintaining organicism and auto-poiesis are everywhere," and this in turn "has led to a post-human landscape in which there is one general dynamic system with animals, machines and digital codes all woven together to constitute a single ecology." (109) Unfortunately, Colebrook argues, "what is not considered are radically differing intensities, or intensive multiplicities, in which different speeds and economies open different and incompossible systems." (ibid.) In other words, what tends to be overlooked by the tendency to stress the single ecology of dynamic systems is a multiplicity of incompossible systems, and consequently the post-human humanities do not, in the end, sufficiently move beyond the problems that plagued traditional humanities in that multiplicities continue to be held subordinate to a dominant "one." Colebrook offers, instead, what she calls an "inhuman approach to knowledge" that can be found in both the work of Deleuze and Serres, and with this approach full justice is given to a "multiplicity of incompossible systems."

All in all, this is a very nice collection of essays, and combined they do offer a convincing case that bringing the concepts of Deleuze and Serres together can reorient our thinking of both Deleuze and Serres in a number of important ways. One can also find, in Herzogenrath and Berressem's final two essays of the collection, important readings of Henry Adams that nicely complement the earlier essays. Although Deleuze scholars, as noted, may disagree with some of the readings and object that some important figures that are largely left undiscussed, the net benefits of this collection far outweigh these minor problems.