Time and Identity

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Joseph Keim Campbell, Michael O'Rourke, and Harry Silverstein (eds.), Time and Identity, The MIT Press, 2010, 330pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780262513975.

Reviewed by Ulrich Meyer, Colgate University


This collection contains some of the papers presented at the Eighth Annual Inland Northwest Philosophy Conference in 2005. Apart from an introduction and a postlude, it comprises fifteen interesting chapters on a wide range of topics, most of which are only tenuously connected to the stated aim of illuminating the concepts of time and identity. There are only three papers about the philosophy of time and none about identity. Most of the volume -- nine chapters -- is concerned with the temporal features of persons, including their deaths. In addition, there is one chapter about modality, one on the philosophy of language, and one about Descartes' proof of the immortality of the soul. This is not a collection where the whole is greater than the sum of the parts, but all the individual contributions are original and worth reading.

Since there are almost as many topics as there are chapters, I thought it best to provide quick sketches of the individual contributions. Hopefully, this will direct potential readers to those parts that would be of most interest to them.

Philosophy of Time

Lawrence Lombard ("Time for a Change: A Polemic against the Presentism-Eternalism Debate") presents an updated defense of his view that nothing of substance is at stake in the debate between presentists and eternalists. According to Lombard, presentism is either trivially true (by claiming that nothing exists now that is not present) or obviously false (by claiming that nothing has, does, or will exist that is not present). In his chapter, Lombard defends this position against the latest generation of de-trivializers.

Mark Hinchliff ("The Identity of the Past") argues against property presentism, the view that no object possesses properties at times at which it does not exist. (It is a contested question whether presentism entails property presentism; Hinchliff thinks that it does not.) Property presentism is the tense-analogue of property actualism, the view that no object possesses properties in possible worlds in which it does not exist. Hinchliff argues that property presentism is in worse shape than property actualism and suggests that this is due to an important difference between time and modality. I wish he had developed this point further, and explored its implications for the question of how our best quantified tense logic might differ from our best quantified modal logic.

Lynne Rudder Baker ("Temporal Reality") defends two theses about time. In the first part of her chapter, she advocates a BA theory of time, which is said to combine features of the traditional A and B theories without collapsing into either. The most unusual feature of her view is that the A-features of time are said to depend on the existence of self-conscious entities: "an event's occurring now depends on someone's being judgmentally aware of it now." In the second part, Baker sketches a "mixed view" of time and existence that looks very much like a quantified tense logic with untensed quantifiers that always range over the same set of objects, which spells out time-relative existence claims in terms of a logically independent existence predicate. For Baker, "the world at a time" consists of all the objects that fall within the scope of the existence predicate at that time, plus all abstract objects. This is said to help explain why neither presentism, nor eternalism, nor the growing block view is entirely correct. However, Baker's view seems largely indistinguishable from the eternalist position in that it treats all times and the objects that exist at them on an equal footing.

Philosophy of Language

Reinaldo Elugardo and Robert Stainton ("Identity through Change and Substitutivity Salva Veritate") argue that names of places, people, and things are polysemic and can be used to refer both to an object-at-a-time and to an object-over-time. They present an interesting argument in favor of this polysemy thesis, but insist that it is solely a thesis in the philosophy of language and compatible with any plausible metaphysics of time. It does not become clear, though, how their view avoids commitment to temporal parts. If objects don't have temporal parts, what are the different referents of polysemic names? More could have been said about this issue.


Geoffrey Gorham ("Descartes on Persistence and Temporal Parts") argues that Descartes is committed to the view that all substances perdure and persist through time by possessing distinct temporal parts or stages. This is said to follow from Descartes' claim that the persistence of objects requires continuous acts of creation that are indistinguishable from the acts that brought the objects into existence in the first place. If that is right, though, then it is not clear how we are to understand Descartes' proof of the immortality of the soul, which assumes that the soul is an indestructible substance. Gorham's proposed solution is to identify Descartes' "thinking natures" with individual essences, which are said to be timeless and thus fall outside the scope of Descartes' perdurantism. But this seems tantamount to abandoning Descartes' proof of the immortality of the soul, rather than showing how it can be reconciled with perdurantism.


John Carroll ("Context, Conditionals, Fatalism, Time Travel, and Freedom") proposes an account of the context-dependence of certain modal claims. Following Robert Stalnaker, let the common ground be information that is presumed to be shared by the participants in a conversation. Then Carroll's proposal is that "Possibly, P" is true in a context C if and only if P is compossible with the common ground of C. (Compossibility presumably gets spelled out in terms of a context-independent notion of possibility.) Having sketched this view, Carroll presents a quick and lucid account of how it deals with subjunctive conditionals, fatalism, time-traveler freedom, and the compatibility of free will and determinism.

People in Time

Ned Markosian ("Identifying the Problem of Personal Identity") advocates a novel way of characterizing the problem of personal identity. Usually, one asks under what condition a person p at time t is identical to a person p' at time t'. Markosian complains that this stacks the deck against the three-dimensionalist, who rejects temporal parts and thus cannot spell out the answer in terms of a relation between two temporal person-slices. Instead of this traditional way of putting the question, Markosian proposes an "episodic characterization" of the problem that asks under what conditions an instance of personhood at time t is part of the same episode (a temporally extended instantiation of that property) as an instance of personhood at time t'. This characterization is claimed to be agnostic about the existence of temporal parts and to allow the three-dimensionalist to deal with previously intractable counterexamples. For instance, Markosian suggests that the three-dimensionalist could deal with fission cases by saying that two episodes of personhood overlap at some earlier time, but then part company.

Neal Tognazzini ("Persistence and Responsibility") argues that a perdurance view -- according to which persons persist by possessing different temporal parts at different times -- does not rule out moral responsibility for past actions. The worry is that a present person can only be held responsible for the actions of a past person if the two are strictly identical. Tognazzini explains how perdurantists can allay such concerns.

Harold Noonan ("Persons, Animals, and Human Beings") defends the psychological continuity view of personal identity against Eric Olson's biological account. Noonan argues for two claims: the offensive thesis that Olson does not have a good account of brain transplant cases and the defensive thesis that Olson's "problem of the thinking animal" is not a serious problem for the psychological continuity view.

Jenann Ismael ("Me, Again") presents a novel account, based on John Perry's notion of unarticulated constituents of belief, of how 'I' differs from other indexicals. After spelling out this account in some detail, she employs it to shed light on what is at stake in theories of the self and in Descartes' cogito.

John Perry ("Selves and Self-Concepts") develops a modern version of a Humean bundle theory of the self. Selves, according to Perry, are bundles of (sometimes competing) cognitive complexes that convert information into action.

Harriet Baber ("Ex Ante Desire and Post Hoc Satisfaction") defends a desire-satisfaction account of welfare against L. W. Sumner, who objects (i) that a desire might be satisfied when one no longer has this particular desire, (ii) that it might be satisfied after one's death, or (iii) that one might be deeply disappointed by the object of a desire once one has attained it. Baber argues that there is a contribution to welfare in these cases because a desire is indeed being satisfied -- even though there is nobody who is feeling satisfied. However, it is not clear that such considerations will carry much weight with those who are not already committed to a desire-satisfaction account of welfare.


The chapters by Ben Bradley ("Eternalism and Death's Badness"), Harry Silverstein ("The Time of the Evil of Death"), and Barbara Baum Levenbook ("The Retroactivity Problem") were part of a symposium on death. In one way or another, they are all concerned with the question of whether a person can be harmed after her death. Bradley thinks that such harm is not only possible, but that it is central to the most plausible account of what makes death bad for its victim. According to Bradley, a person is being harmed at time t' by her death D at an earlier time t if she would have lived a good life at t' had D not occurred at t. But while many philosophers are happy to attribute properties to objects at times at which they do not exist, they usually make a distinction between properties that are existence-entailing ("has mass 1 kg") and those that are not ("is famous"). The idea is that only the latter can be truly attributed to non-existents. If that is right, though, then Bradley needs more than just the possibility of attributing properties to people after their death; he also needs to show that -- appearances to the contrary notwithstanding -- "being harmed" is not in fact existence-entailing.

Silverstein agrees with Bradley that people are being harmed by their deaths, but denies that they are being harmed posthumously. For him, what accounts for the badness of death is the fact that longer lives are usually better than shorter ones. He does not think that this requires an answer to the question of when death is an evil for the person who dies. If we nevertheless demand an answer to this question, he suggests, then we should say that the death is an evil during the person's entire life. This strikes me as being as odd as Bradley's proposal: isn't the obvious thing to say that the time at which a person is being harmed by her death D at time t is just the time t at which the death occurs? The death D happens to her and it is what prevents her from continuing her good life.

Levenbook's chapter is about a slightly more general problem. She is concerned with any harm to the dead, not merely with the narrow question of whether the dead are harmed by their own death. Examples of such postmortem harm might be (i) breaking a promise made to someone during their lifetime or (ii) making someone's life pointless after the fact, say, by destroying an artist's oeuvre. Unlike Bradley, Levenbook begins with the assumption that any harm to the dead would have to be harm to an antemortem person. This leads to what she calls the retroactivity problem for theories of postmortem harm: how can events that occur after a person's death harm her during her lifetime? In her carefully argued chapter, Levenbook considers various ways of spelling out the retroactivity problem. She rejects some attempts while conditionally endorsing others, but leaves the final answer to future work.

Bradley and Silverstein spend much time on explaining how their views about the badness of death require a rejection of presentism. I am inclined to agree with Levenbook's assessment that this isn't really a problem for the metaphysics of time, but a problem for a substantive moral theory of "good for" and "bad for."