Time and Philosophy: A History of Continental Thought

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John McCumber, Time and Philosophy: A History of Continental Thought, Acumen, 2011, 414pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844652761.

Reviewed by Alan D. Schrift, Grinnell College


John McCumber assigns himself a noble task when he sets out to tell us his "history of continental thought," namely, to articulate the "unified tradition" that "serves as a sort of backbone" which can come close to "encompassing the entire diversity of continental philosophy" (4). This task is not only noble but critically important insofar as, as the text's very first sentence proclaims, "Continental philosophy is the most important intellectual tradition of the past two centuries" (1). While Karl Marx's inclusion within the continental canon appears sufficient to justify this grandiose claim, the widespread lack of understanding, if not misunderstanding, within the Anglophone world of continental philosophy and what its practitioners are doing seems to be the real impetus motivating McCumber's writing. To help understand what unifies those working within the tradition of continental philosophy, McCumber sets continental philosophy up against what he calls "traditional philosophy," by which he understands, following Heidegger, "philosophy that locates true reality in an atemporal domain" (4). "Traditional philosophy" -- whether in the form of Parmenidean Being, Platonic Forms, Aristotelian essences, Kantian transcendental structures of the human mind, or the logically manipulated world of propositions -- places what is ultimately real in some timeless and unchanging realm. Continental philosophy, however, understands itself to be firmly situated within time and history while trying to understand things and actions that are themselves equally so situated within the temporal realm.

The remainder of the book sets out to demonstrate that an attention to temporality and history does in fact unify the tradition of continental philosophy. In part I, "Germany, 1790-1890," McCumber discusses the collapse of Kantian philosophy that results from Kant's inability to see that his philosophical position should have led him to conclusions situated within the temporal world. It is Kant's refusal to turn away from the atemporal and transcendental that inspires, in one way or another, the remaining figures of the German nineteenth century to turn their attention towards temporality, with Hegel situating philosophy with respect to its past, while Marx, Kierkegaard, and Nietzsche each offer different views of philosophizing with an eye toward a determinate, dreadful, or boundless future, respectively. In part II, "Germany and America, 1900-1968," McCumber sets up a similar structure, beginning with a discussion of Husserl as an attempt to return to traditional philosophy, followed by chapters that show how this attempt inspires Heidegger, Arendt, and Adorno and Horkheimer to each, in very different ways, aggressively resituate philosophical attention on finitude, mortality, and the historically contextualized features of everyday life. Part III, "France, 1945-2004," turns to the different ways in which Sartre, Beauvoir, Foucault, and Derrida each can be seen to focus on the future as they temporalize philosophical reflection. And in the much shorter and final Part IV, "Onwards, 2011-," McCumber turns to Alain Badiou, Jacques Rancière, Judith Butler, and Giorgio Agamben, showing in each case that they draw upon the history of continental thought that has preceded them while once again situating their own thought firmly within both temporality and the present moment as they open up new domains of philosophical reflection.

At one level, I am broadly sympathetic to what McCumber is trying to do. There do seem to me to be certain unifying themes that run through the work of the vast majority of philosophers associated with the continental tradition. And one of these unifying themes, which I would situate within a Nietzschean rather than Heideggerian frame (though it is there in Heidegger as well), clearly concerns locating what is worthy of philosophical reflection in what Nietzsche, following Heraclitus, called the world of becoming, the world that Nietzsche affirms while repudiating the "error" of a "real" or "true" world of Being -- the wahre Welt  -- whose three major historical moments Nietzsche recounts in the famous chapter of Twilight of the Idols in which he chronicles the history of this "error," first in Plato, then in Christianity, and finally in Kant. But where I think McCumber gets into some trouble is that his story is a bit too focused on this one theme, and while I have no objections to some of his chapters, there are others in which the excessive focus on a certain account of temporality leads to his offering interpretations of the philosopher being discussed that I think distort, in some cases significantly, how their work should be understood.

Before turning to the individual chapters, a few other general comments about the way McCumber has approached his task are in order. His goal is not only to show that the continental tradition can be unified around its attention to temporality; in addition, he wants to emphasize, perhaps to those very Anglo-American readers who might be suspicious of this, the deeply philosophical nature of the thought he examines. To that end, most of the chapters make reference, sometimes quite briefly, to Aristotle, highlighting how the philosopher being discussed is articulating a view either similar to or easily related to a view we can locate in Aristotle's works. In addition, and to McCumber's great credit, he maintains a commitment to clarity of expression, even when explaining why, on occasion, the philosopher being discussed is led into somewhat obscure modes of expression. This, it should be noted, will make the book particularly valuable to introductory students, as will the decision, one not all readers might agree with, to focus each chapter on one or more representative texts by the author that are readily available in English. This allows each chapter to proceed as a reading of a text, or texts, and so will make the volume appropriate for classroom use.

I turning now to some of the specific chapters. McCumber is, not surprisingly given his previous work, very good when it comes to explaining the idealists, and his chapters on both Kant and Husserl make very clear how they each make an unnecessary turn (in Husserl's case, a return) to the atemporal that motivates Hegel and Heidegger to respond by aggressively situating their own philosophical projects firmly within time and history. The chapter on Heidegger in particular is masterful, offering a gloss on several of the major stages in the existential analytic of Being and Timebefore turning first to "The Origin of the Work of Art" and then "The Question Concerning Technology." The goal throughout the chapter is to show how Heidegger turns from the various open-ended accounts of the future in nineteenth-century continental thought to the finite future located in death as one's ownmost possibility, in the work of art as a disclosure of truth/earth, and in the question of how to appropriately take account of the finitude of the future. Along the way, McCumber offers an exceptionally clear account of how the so-called "later Heidegger" can and should be seen to develop out of Being and Time, all the while also laying the groundwork for situating the continental tradition that follows Heidegger.

The chapter on Hegel is also admirably clear, offering a necessarily selective account of Hegel's Phenomenology of Spirit before turning to Reason in History. But where some of McCumber's idiosyncratic choices (e.g., of "The Origin of the Work of Art" as"perhaps Heidegger's most important single text" [176]) did not divert his Heidegger chapter from its goal, I'm not sure the same can be said for the Hegel chapter insofar as his discussion of the Phenomenology is largely restricted to "discussing its two most important sections, the first and the last" (32). The problem here is that the Hegel chapter sets the stage for the discussions of Marx, Kierkegaard, and Nietzsche, as the Heidegger chapter sets the stage for all that follows in the account of the twentieth and twenty-first centuries. But it does not appear to me that Hegel's accounts of sense-certainty or absolute knowing are up to the task, while the chapters in the Phenomenology that do set the stage for much of the nineteenth century as well as much of twentieth-century continental philosophy -- the accounts of desire and of the independence and dependence of self-consciousness in the chapter on "The Truth of Self-Certainty" -- are barely mentioned. Yet it is just these chapters that inspire Marx to locate labor as the essence of human being and lead Nietzsche to frame the genealogy of morality in terms of masters and slaves, while it is difficult to imagine Sartre's account of self and other or Lacan's mirror stage taking shape in the ways that they did without their engaging Hegel's account of the struggle for recognition.

McCumber's chapters on Marx and Sartre are, in fact, two of the weaker chapters, in part because each tries to read its subject into a grand narrative within which neither really fits. In the case of Marx, McCumber focuses on the Economic and Philosophical Manuscripts of 1844 and The Communist Manifesto to support his claim that Marx follows Hegel in looking back to the past, but then he argues that Marx makes the mistake of drawing from this past evidence that leads him to predict the future and, moreover, to predict a future that in fact did not turn out to be the case. While this general approach to Marx is not indefensible, too many of the particular claims made in the chapter involve misreadings of Marx's texts and misunderstandings of Marx's project. For example, Marx is criticized for having "missed . . . entirely" the oppression of women because he was committed to only one historical story, "that of class struggle" (66). Such a claim might surprise readers of The German Ideology, where one finds Marx and Engels identifying the first form of the division of labor "in the family, where wife and children are the slaves of the husband" and where this "latent slavery" is identified as "the first property."[1]

Elsewhere, Marx is faulted for providing, at the end of the second part of the Manifesto, "predictions of the future" that will follow the communist revolution, predictions like the abolition of the right of inheritance or a heavy progressive income tax. Such "conjectures, weak as they are," writes McCumber, "show that Marx wants more than Hegel did," for example, when in the Philosophy of Right, he "explicitly refused to 'issue instructions on how the world ought to be'" (65). The problem, though, is that The Communist Manifesto is not a work of philosophy; it's the program of a political party which is not so much predicting the future as calling for political change. Elsewhere, he criticizes Marx for going beyond Hegelian interpretation in his belief that he had "attained a final truth, and so lapses into traditional philosophy" (75). While Marx may have made a mistake in claiming that he attained some final truth, he did not thereby so much lapse into traditional philosophy as into science. And that is not surprising insofar as Marx, for most of his career, thought of himself not as a philosopher but as a scientist, historian, and economist. (It is perhaps also worth noting that a failure to distinguish between Marx's view of labor as a productive human activity and wage labor as a corruption of that productive activity by replacing the natural relation between human producer and product with the unnatural relationship between labor and wages disrupts not only this chapter but comes back to create problems in McCumber's chapter on Arendt (cf. 219)).

When he turns to Sartre, the question of temporality comes to the center as he tries to bring Sartre close to Husserl both in terms of treating consciousness as "a closed realm that must be explained entirely in its own terms" and as "something whose basic structures are unaffected by time" (256). The problem, though, is that Sartre holds neither of these views, especially if one looks to his major work, Being and Nothingness. There we are told, for example, in the Introduction that insofar as all consciousness is consciousness of something, "this means that there is no consciousness which is not a positing of a transcendent object." When Sartre says "I am conscious of a table," this does not mean a table is "in consciousness, not even in the capacity of a representation. A table is in space, beside the window, etc." Which is to say that "the first procedure of philosophy ought to be to expel things from consciousness and to reestablish its true connection with the world, to know that consciousness is a positional consciousness of the world."[2]

Not only is consciousness not unaffected by time; rather, temporality is among the immediate structures of consciousness insofar as consciousness is always conscious of its possibilities. Sartre makes this point through the ontology of Being and Nothingness, an ontology McCumber tries to avoid. But when we look at Sartre's ontology, the issue is clear: the being of consciousness is the being of the for-itself (pour-soi). And being-for-itself "is a being which is not what it is and which is what it is not [d'être qui n'est pas ce qu'il est et qui est ce qu'il n'est pas]."[3] What this means, of course, can only be understood in terms of temporality: insofar as the being of consciousness is the being of the for-itself, consciousness is "a being which is not what it [presently, as the totality of its past,] is [insofar as it is what it will later become,] and which is what it is not [yet but will be in the future]." Which is to say that time is at play in the very foundational structures of consciousness itself, as Sartre makes equally clear when he discusses the intentionality of action in terms of what he calls "the unity of the three temporal ekstases": the upsurge of the act in the present is directed toward an end or temporization in the future which implies a cause or motive that points back to my past.[4]

The curious thing is that McCumber knows all of this: he acknowledges that Sartre follows Heidegger in privileging the future (262), and that Sartre affirms that we are continually becoming other than ourselves "simply because we are in time" (268). But all the same, his basic thesis in this chapter is that Sartre is committed to a view of consciousness and nihilation that is atemporal, and this results in several inconsistencies in this chapter that are never resolved. These inconsistencies carry over into the next chapter on Beauvoir's Ethics of Ambiguity, where she is credited for avoiding many of Sartre's mistakes; but a more sympathetic reader of Sartre will find this chapter crediting Beauvoir for views that seem quite Sartrean: for example, because Beauvoir is engaged in putting forward an ethics and not an ontology, "The fundamental movement of our consciousness is thus a movement towards as much as away from. Sartre not only did not see this, but could not have, for it means that consciousness is positively affected by the external world on its deepest levels" [312]. One has to wonder what Sartre might mean by "facticity" if not consciousness engaging -- being affected by -- the external world?

Similarly, there are annoying missteps and oversimplifications in many of the other chapters that will frustrate the more knowledgeable reader. For example, it not the case that On the Genealogy of Morality "like all of Nietzsche's works . . . is aphoristic in nature" (102; my emphasis) -- neither The Birth of Tragedy nor the four Untimely Meditations are in any sense "aphoristic" works. Further many have argued that Nietzsche's Genealogy in fact does not consist "of independent observations and trains of thought rather than a single overarching argument" (102), but instead contains three distinct and coherent essays that each present and defend a single central thesis. For example, the Third Essay is a sustained discussion of the meaning of the ascetic ideal which works toward supporting the conclusion that this ideal saved the will [and thereby humanity] by encouraging it to will nothingness rather than not will at all.

Another perhaps more significant misstep presents itself in the interpretation of Foucault's Discipline and Punish, where the discussion leads to an account of "what Foucault calls a 'docile body': a body whose movements are controlled by those in power, not by your own individual soul" (329). The problem here is that this is exactly not what Foucault means by a disciplined and docile body. McCumber's allegiance to Aristotle, for whom "a human being is matter under control," leads him to conclude that modern military discipline produces a body controlled "not from within . . . but by society" (327). But this results in his missing the Nietzschean dimension of Foucault's account of the internalization of discipline in which "the soul is the effect and instrument of a political anatomy; the soul is the prison of the body."[5] In other words, through the panoptical disciplinary regime of modernity, Foucault departs from the Aristotelian model and rejects the rigid distinction between the interiority (autonomy) and exteriority (society) of classical accounts of how power is exercised.

It may be that in a book like this one, which is trying to paint with a very broad brush the single defining feature of the history of continental thought, such specific criticisms of particular interpretations is, as the cliché goes, spending too much time with the trees and losing the beauty and grandeur of the forest. This may be the case, and so it is worth recalling that some of the trees are painted very clearly and accurately in ways that do help us to understand the forest, in particular, the chapters on Kant, Kierkegaard, Husserl, Heidegger, Adorno and Horkheimer, Derrida, and the masterful closing chapters on Badiou, Rancière, Agamben, and Butler. But I would also be remiss if I failed to mention a serious problem with McCumber's forest, a problem that he is well aware of, namely, the omission from this history of Jürgen Habermas.

Unlike the decisions to omit thinkers like Schelling, Dilthey, Merleau-Ponty, Levinas, Gadamer, Ricoeur, or Deleuze, the omission of Habermas is not just a function of the impossibility of including every important continental philosophy. Rather, Habermas has to be excluded because, as McCumber readily admits, he just doesn't fit the grand narrative McCumber wants to tell insofar as Habermas does not "reject atemporal truths" (11). While Habermas shares this orientation with Kant and Husserl, unlike them, he can be omitted because he has not provoked a productive temporalizing response like those of his two transcendentalist predecessors. While someone more sympathetic to the Habermasian project might argue that some among the so-called "third generation" of critical theorists have in fact produced such temporalizing responses, my worry is a little different. It concerns the status of a central interpretative thesis of the history of continental thought that requires the omission of a figure like Habermas, and the setting aside of Kant and Husserl as productive critical foils rather than integral figures in that tradition. Would a history that tried to tell its story in terms of the different ways in which an interpreting human agent tried to understand her world face such problems of excluding central figures in the canon from its narrative? Or a story focused on various philosophies of difference? Or even a narrative which tries to reframe temporality in terms of approaches to history and historicity rather than as the antithesis of atemporality? Others will have to answer these questions, and perhaps tell these histories. But McCumber is certainly to be acknowledged and credited for offering us his history.

[1] Robert C. Tucker, ed., The Marx-Engels Reader (New York: Norton, 1978), 159.

[2] Jean-Paul Sartre, Being and Nothingness: An Essay on Phenomenological Ontology, trans. Hazel E. Barnes (New York: Philosophical Library, 1956), li.

[3] Ibid., 79.

[4] Ibid., 436.

[5] Michel Foucault, Discipline and Punish: The Birth of the Prison, trans. Alan Sheridan (New York: Pantheon Books, 1977), 30.