Time and the Philosophy of Action

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Roman Altshuler and Michael J. Sigrist (eds.), Time and the Philosophy of Action, Routledge, 2016, 289pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415735247.

Reviewed by Timothy Cleveland, New Mexico State University


Action takes time, unfolds in time. Intentions persist through time, our deliberations are sensitive to time, our commitments maintained through time. So much seems mere truism. The promise of this collection -- the result of the Time and Agency Conference held at George Washington University in 2011 -- is to reveal substantial truths behind these apparent truisms -- "that time structures agency from within", "that time is an ineliminable constituent of agency" (1). Put simply, to understand action we must understand the role of time in action, intention, deliberation, and commitment. But don't be misled. The thesis is not about the metaphysics of time at all, as though the truth about agency turns on debates about the nature of time. More correctly, the idea is that any correct characterization of agency must make mention of time. Yet as these diverse essays on action show, there are various ways -- some with very little in common -- to construe the role of time in action, what the editors like to call "the temporality of action." Though I did not come away convinced that there was some deep philosophical point about time and action that unifies them all, there are some very good essays here that make serious contributions to philosophy of action. None of these is for the novice or the faint of heart, unnerved by technicality and jargon. But there are indeed several that anyone interested in action should read.

The 16 essays are divided into four parts along with the editors' helpful introduction: Part I "The Metaphysics of Action," Part II "Diachronic Practical Rationality," Part III "Deliberation, Motivation, and Agency," and Part IV "Phenomenology and the Temporality of Agency."

The essays in Part I all bear directly on the problem of basic actions. The issue originated with Arthur Danto's worry over an infinite regress of actions. We do many things, it seems, by doing other things. I pay my electric bill by writing a check. I write the check by pushing the pen across the paper. I push my pen across the paper by moving my hand. I move my hand by . . . what? There better be things I do without doing anything else. Otherwise, an infinite regress looms. As Ben Wolfson aptly puts it in his contribution, "it can't be turtles all the way down" (52). Danto's concern was with a regress of causes. His solution was to stop the buck at basic bodily movement. Basic actions are bodily movements we perform without doing anything else to cause them. Nonetheless, a problem remains. Any bodily movement we perform takes time. So, as it unfolds, it can be frustrated before it comes to fruition. In principle, this seems possible for any movement that takes time. Therefore, there seems to be no bodily candidate for basic actions.

In "Slip-Proof Actions," Santiago Amaya proposes to sidestep this problem with a hint from slips of the tongue. These occur when we intend to say something by speaking but end up saying something else. Our action is frustrated because we slip. Psycholinguistics seems to show however that some speech acts are slip-proof. Anyone with the ability to speak a language will have a repertoire of linguistic competencies that "Under normal circumstances" are "protected from certain kinds of mistakes" (27): "Speakers of the language do not slip in uttering phonemes of their language" (28). Since speech acts are a paradigm of intentional action, Amaya suggests we generalize from their case and define basic actions as those that are slip-proof. We all have a range of abilities that we cannot fail in performing. This idea is interesting and original. I would note here only that this does not show that there is a kind of action, say bodily movements, that will always count as basic. Basic actions will be relative to each agent's competencies.

Michael Thompson has posed a different kind of infinite regress to challenge the idea of basic actions.[1] If an action takes any finite amount of time, that time can in principle be divided in half. Since any half will take finite time, this can go on Zeno-wise endlessly. I cannot intend to move my hand from one point in time to another without intending to move it half that way through time, and so on endlessly. So, there is no contender for a basic action. Kim Frost ( "The Antinomy of Basic Action") takes the horns of the dilemma: either there must be basic action for fear of an infinite regress of causes (Danto) or there can be no basic actions since any action in time decomposes Zeno-wise into a never-ending set of intentional actions (Thompson). Frost challenges Thompson's horn by denying that all the temporal segments of a movement are intentional actions. Instead, they are aspects of the action, non-intentional activities of an agent. Agents can perform these activities directly. Basic intentional actions are unnecessary.

In a similar vein to Amaya, though without the help of empirical support from psycholinguistics, Wolfson ("Second Nature and Basic Action") argues that we have certain rational capacities that are second nature to us, in that we perform them without any mean-ends reasoning. Helen Steward, in the final paper in Part I "Making the Agent Reappear: How Processes Might Help," is unmoved by the problem of basic actions. Trouble starts from thinking of actions as events and not as processes. If action is a kind of event -- one caused by beliefs and desires, then the agent drops out of the picture. Events do not change. Processes however do. Agents are what bring about changes in the processes that are our actions. Her suggestion is obviously only as good as the distinction between events and processes. The essays that comprise Part I all address well-defined problems and arguments about agency and basic action. Philosophers interested in basic action would do well to study these essays. Note however that none turns on any claims about the nature of time, merely that actions take time.

The papers in Part II are less unified by a single clearly stated problem or set of arguments. They all have to do, in one way or another, with an agent's relation to his/her past and future selves. The first two essays have to do with the nature of intentions for future actions. According to Michael Bratman, intentions must be stable over time.[2] The intention I form now must, in some sense, commit me in the future to perform the action. But in what sense exactly, given that we often revise our plans? Gregory Kafka's notorious Toxin Puzzle accentuates the problem. Suppose you are offered $1,000,000 if you will simply intend to drink a toxin that will make you sick the next day. The deal comes with a proviso -- if you can do this, the money will be put in your account before the time comes to drink the toxin. Can you do it? Seems not. You know now that your future self will have no reason to drink the toxin when the time comes, so you cannot now intend in the future to drink the toxin. The intention is too unstable to form.

For Bratman, to form an intention now I must expect that my future self will not regret it. Edward S. Hinchman disagrees and develops an alternative account in "'What on Earth Was I Thinking?' How Anticipating Plan's End Places an Intention in Time." Instead of regret, trust is what matters. In intending now, I can't expect my future self to regret having trusted me when he acts on my present intention. Supposedly, this trust better explains so-called "agential authority." By intending now, I imagine my future self happy to have trusted that I spoke for him. These ideas are difficult to evaluate, in part, because Hinchman's complex sentences, along with their abstract phrasing, are often hard to track. They could surely be put more clearly.

Sometimes uncertainty about the future is enough to destabilize our intentions and our plans. In his essay, "Pro-Tempore Disjunctive Intentions," Luca Ferrero argues that the best way to increase stability in our plans for the future is to form pro-tempore disjunctive intentions. I intend to do one thing or intend to do another "for the time being," (108) though I know when the time comes I cannot do both. These disjunctive intentions leave both options open as long as possible, and so add flexibility to my plans. Ferrero claims that his analysis of these disjunctive intentions provides a strategy additional to that of conditional intentions. But isn't any pro-tempore disjunction a conditional by another name? Ferrero does say that a pro-tempore disjunctive intention "might transform into a combination of two conditional plans, with mutually exclusive antecedents" (113), but he seems to ignore the possibility that the original disjunctive intention is simply a conditional intention.

The last two essays in Part II take up entirely different topics. Some of the projects we commit ourselves to are crucial to shaping who we are. We value some things and disregard others. Our projects give us reasons. Monika Betzler's "Evaluative Commitments: How They Guide Us Over Time and Why" wonders where these projects get their normative force. Her answer is that to value a project is valuable in and of itself. Our commitment makes the project valuable, not the content of the project. The reasons that our projects generate are not absolute, Betzler admits. Yet surely some projects are absolutely indefensible despite our commitment. However, she is silent on how they "prove ultimately ungrounded" (138).

Next is Daniel D. Hutto and Patrick McGivern's "Updating the Story of Our Mental Time Travel: Narrating and Engaging with Our Possible Pasts and Futures." Crucial to our ability to makes plans is being able to recall our past and imagine our future selves. Cognitive science connects this ability with our capacity to understand the mental lives of others. The traditional explanation is that we subsume the behavior of others under psychological laws we have internalized and thus understand them. Another explanation is that we project ourselves into the mental lives of others. But there is a third possibility. Our ability to understand others, and so our past and future selves, lies in our narrative abilities. This is an interesting idea that, as the authors say, "lays the ground for further research" (154), but narratives come in many forms. I wonder whether it is possible, given how vaguely narratives are characterized here, to tell a story about the nature of narrative that could ground an empirical theory.

The papers in Part IIIĀ  are even more diverse in methodology and style than those in Part II. Three of the four deal with when deliberation occurs in rational action. It might seem natural to suppose that deliberating about what to do must take place before or along with our actions. The three contributions to this topic all disagree. John Drummond's "Time and the 'Antinomies' of Deliberation" as well as Jonathan Webber's "Habituation and First-Person Authority" focus on the relationship between deliberation and habit. Drummond's antinomies concern whether an action done after deliberation is more virtuous than one done without deliberation. Consider Aristotle's description of the brave person who "acts according to the merits of the case and in whatever way reason directs" but is braver if acting from "a state of character."[3] Drummond accepts John Cooper's way out of this apparent inconsistency. The person who acts out of habit -- from a state of character -- is able, after the fact, to give the actual reasons for so acting. Drummond elaborates this idea in Husserl's terms to sketch a phenomenology of the "temporality at work in agency," that "the present moment in which an agent acts incorporates and is informed by both the past and the future" (178). Though this is interesting, I am unsure how this shores up any shortcoming in Cooper's explanation. Webber appeals to work in experimental social psychology to make his case. Based on recent research on implicit bias, he argues that "habituation can render a belief beyond direct deliberative control" (198). Some beliefs become so ingrained through repeated use in our reasoning that they are resistant to revision. This result supposedly shows "that our form of rationality is essentially temporal" (203) and undermines first-person authority.

J. David Velleman ("Time for Action") suggests an "introspective experiment" for his "supervisory conception of practical reasoning" (173). The standard picture of intentional action is causal: "In order to cause the action, the agent's intention must precede it," or alternatively, "be contemporaneous with it" (164). Velleman provides an interesting debunking explanation for the appeal of the standard picture: metaphors -- "weighing reasons," "not having enough time to think" -- are taken literally. These points are well-taken and insightful. I'm less sure of Velleman's new supervisory picture. Most of the time, when you act, your "brain and body go about their business" (169), but sometimes in the midst of this activity, "practical reason has to take charge" and "your intending takes the form of superintending" (169). "What differentiates action from mere behavior is that it supervised" (170). But this is merely another metaphor. Why should we take this one literally? Velleman offers a method of empirical confirmation. Catch yourself in the midst of acting, and then introspect. "Where you expected to find the Mythical Rational Agent, you'll find the Supervisor instead" (173). Would that philosophy were so easy. Here I suspect we'll detect what our metaphors lead us to expect. Moreover, I cannot but see this picture as more Cartesian than Descartes, who said, "I am present not merely to my body the way a sailor is present in a ship."[4] What's the difference between this sailor and Velleman's supervisor?

The final essay of Part III, Shaun Gallagher's "Timing is Not Everything: The Intrinsic Temporality of Action," is an account of agency in terms of Husserl's temporal theory of experience, and it seems to me that it could just as easily have been included in Part IV, "Phenomenology and the Temporality of Agency." All the essays on phenomenology, including Gallagher's as well as B. Scot Rousse's "Care, Death, and Time in Heidegger and Frankfurt" and David Ciavatta's "Merleau-Ponty on the Temporality of Practical Dispositions," have in common the thesis that, as Ciavatta puts it, "our understanding of time must begin with our lived experience of it," (242). This lived time is, as Gallagher writes, "not objective time that can be measured by a clock" (206). For phenomenologists, the present is in some sense full of the past and pregnant with the future. Now, unlike and far from the essays in Part I, we have arrived at a claim that might genuinely be about the nature of time and the "temporality of agency." For these philosophers, the metaphysics of time cannot be articulated independently of our experience of time. These ideas, though suggestive, need to be made more clear. These essays are hard going for at least two reasons: the technical language is abstract and obtuse, and it is often unclear exactly what philosophical problem the theory is supposed to solve. A notable exception is Rousse's illuminating piece on Heidegger, in which he explains Heidegger's notion of care by contrast to Harry Frankfurt's. I would recommend Rousse's work to anyone interested in either philosopher. Micah Tillman's "Acts as Changes" may not repay the work it takes to understand it. For example, one kind action occurs when an agent "changes itself into itself" (260)! Tillman claims "a thing is changed by something into nothing" when, for example, "a vase is destroyed by a sledgehammer" (258). Such talk of change seems too obscure or metaphorical to base a theory on. The last essay, Henry Somers-Hall's "Hamlet and the Time of Action," makes some interesting points about the role of time in tragedy in Aristotle and Shakespeare. His discussion takes us, by a very indirect philosophical path, far from where the book began.[5]

[1] Michael Thompson, Life and Action, Harvard University Press: (2008).

[2] Michael Bratman, Intentions, Plans, and Practical Reason, Harvard University Press: (1987).

[3] Phrases from Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics, 1115b19, 1117a20 (quoted by Drummond).

[4] Rene Descartes, Meditations on First Philosophy, excerpt from Meditation VI.

[5] Thanks to Jean-Paul Vessel and Mark Walker for their discussion of these issues and very helpful comments on earlier drafts of this review.