Time and the Shared World: Heidegger on Social Relations

Placeholder book cover

Irene McMullin, Time and the Shared World: Heidegger on Social Relations, Northwestern University Press, 2013, 298pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780810129023.

Reviewed by Scott Campbell, Nazareth College


In a way, the future of Heidegger studies depends on the kind of book written by Irene McMullin. Although Heidegger died in 1976, new volumes of his work are still appearing in the Gesamtausgabe  and then being translated into English and other languages. Given the density and complexity of Heidegger's ideas, many interpreters aim to explicate his texts, mining them for philosophical insight. Such analyses are essential. At some point, though, new editions of Heidegger's work will cease appearing, and Heidegger scholarship will need to go to greater lengths to apply his ideas to philosophical problems, shifting from explication to application and interpretation. McMullin aims to take a bold step in that direction. To describe the work she is doing, she employs the analogy of building a house (9). She uses Heidegger's ideas as a foundation and then advances an original argument about how to think about intersubjectivity in a Heideggerian way, but which also goes beyond what Heidegger actually said.

McMullin uses the Introduction and Chapter 1 to establish the explicitly phenomenological understanding of Dasein, with its roots in Husserlian phenomenology, as a being that is fundamentally being-with-others and not a Cartesian cogito inescapably trapped within the confines of its own inner life (16). The following two chapters address certain problems with this view. Given that Dasein lives in a shared world with others, McMullin asks whether or not Dasein can have its own self-understanding (Chapter 2) and, taking her cue from Sartre's critique of Heidegger, whether or not Dasein can account for the particular individuality of other people (Chapter 3). In the former case, her response is that Dasein retains its individuality, what Heidegger calls "mineness," as it negotiates shared norms in the public world. In the latter case, McMullin claims, similarly, that for Heidegger ontological categories about Dasein's being are always related to particular ontic encounters. These analyses allow her to show how Heidegger develops a new approach to a priori structures as being responsive and sensitive to the very beings that those structures are meant to interpret, and thus not as purely formal structures being imposed upon them (Chapter 4). She calls this a "theory of responsive categories" that "can be successfully applied to the case of being-with" (79).

The heart of the book, found in Chapter 5, takes up this issue of being-with's responsive categories. McMullin describes various modes of temporality, including originary time, world time, and ordinary time, and highlights a distinction in Heidegger's work, often contested, between the latter two. Her argument is that while it is often taken to be so, originary time is not authentic, but rather "modally indifferent" (115), i.e., neither authentic nor inauthentic. This originary time then expresses itself in world time (123), and in the transcendence from one to the other we find different structures of temporality -- spannedness, datability, publicity, and significance -- according to which we can respond to the originary temporality of others in a shared world defined by common norms of meaning and significance.

McMullin constructs her thesis about Heideggerian intersubjectivity in Chapter 6. In her analogy of the house, this would be the second floor. She attempts to synthesize Heideggger's notion of solicitude with Dasein's way of responding to the temporality of others from previous chapters in order to develop themes of respect, existential self-responsibility, recognizing and acknowledging others, shared public standards, discourse, communication, and even poetry, among others. All of these involve recognizing the temporal particularity of others without recourse to the language of authenticity and inauthenticity. Finally, Chapter 7 takes up the concepts of leaping-in (inauthentic) and leaping-ahead (authentic) but re-thinks these modes of Dasein's being in light of all that she has said about recognizing the temporality of others in a shared world of meaning. The book ends with a marvelous example of authentic human interaction.

To my mind, the single most important advance that McMullin makes is in helping us to reconsider authenticity and inauthenticity in Being and Time, so that they are not viewed as a simple dichotomy, but rather as two extremes of a continuum that allows for a variety of different human interactions. The idea that Dasein can only be either one or the other, which even Heidegger sometimes seems to suggest, has for many years prevented the kind of nuanced interpretation of intersubjectivity across a broad range of human interactions that McMullin provides here. This has been coupled with the equally mistaken belief that authenticity and inauthenticity are conditions of Dasein's being and that one might shift, permanently, from one to the other. Through careful analyses of Heidegger's texts, McMullin makes the justification for a modally indifferent temporality, originary temporality, that is neither authentic nor inauthentic but which admits of a variety of meaningful human interactions.

One of the most trenchant critiques of Being and Time is that the ontological structures of Dasein that are articulated in it are so formal that they do not provide much help to someone trying to negotiate the complexities of social interaction with particular human beings. McMullin shows that for Heidegger the a priori structures of Dasein facilitate social interaction, and the key to this relationship is time. Some of the most powerful moments of this book can be found in Chapter 5 where she discusses how we recognize the particularity and individuality of other people through an ecstatic encounter with their temporality, as we construct with them a shared world of meaning. In the conclusion to that chapter, McMullin writes, "Other Dasein are given in the particularity of their temporal self-disclosure -- their expressive now-saying -- and it is only thus that we can co-constitute the world" (140).

A critical piece of McMullin's argument is that being-with is not identical with fallenness (see especially 109-115) and that average everydayness is not identical with fallenness, especially with respect to how we interact with other people (see especially 194-198). Although he is often critical of average everydayness and speaks of it in derogatory terms in Being and Timeand elsewhere, Heidegger is a phenomenologist, and so methodologically his orientation is to start philosophizing in average, everyday life. If fallenness belongs ineluctably to the being of Dasein, then authenticity would become impossible (110).

McMullin makes it possible for us to give a meaningful account of Heidegger's notion of Dasein as a worlding being that is not simply inauthentic in average, everyday life. While everydayness may tempt us to inauthenticity, and thus to self-alienation, idle ways of speaking, and dereliction of our responsibilities, average everydayness itself is modally indifferent and thus neither authentic nor inauthentic (198). McMullin resuscitates those sections of Being and Time that show how Dasein lives in a world and thus in a context of meaningful relationships with other people over against those sections that describe average, everyday life as inauthentic. This is extremely important work. It skillfully shows that Heidegger was not so critical of average, everyday life as it has been thought, and it helps us to make sense of his early lecture courses, where we often find him speaking positively of everyday life (see especially GA 58 The Basic Problems of Phenomenology).

It is fascinating to read McMullin's work as she attempts to develop themes like respect, discourse, and Dasein-acknowledgment on Heidegger's terms but without recourse to the language of authenticity and inauthenticity. Of respect, she writes, "I experience the other person as a person through the limiting of my own temporal expression in the face of her temporal alterity -- and respect is the name of this experience" (159). Of discourse she writes:

We can see now that the understanding given in discourse -- understanding in Heidegger's sense of ways for me to be in the world -- can therefore be characterized as a type ofparticipation in the other's meaningful, committed activities of existing. Particular ways of being in the world are not simply mine but ours. (177)

McMullin's point is that in all modes of social interaction, even those that are harmful to someone else, there is a fundamental acknowledgment of the other Dasein prior to the attribution of authenticity or inauthenticity. The a priori structure of being-with is such that we always share a world with others, acknowledge them, and have temporalizing commitments to them.

McMullin's analysis provokes a number of critical questions. One might wonder, for example, why this continuum of solicitude, where authenticity and inauthenticity are the extremes, seems to lack any distinction. It is amazing that McMullin is using Heidegger to talk about respect, existential self-responsibility, discourse, poetry, and even something like moral obligation (see below) without mentioning authenticity and inauthenticity. But the continuum would need to have degrees. McMullin says as much from time to time, as when she speaks of different types of Dasein-acknowledgment: "we will analyze the underlying structure of Fürsorge [solicitude] at work throughout the entire continuum and determine thereby what type of Dasein acknowledgment characterizes every intersubjective encounter" (143). But throughout the book, she also insists that this continuum is "modally undifferentiated," "indifferent," and "neutral." It is difficult to conceive of a notion of respect, for example, or of meaning and significance, that somehow appears along a neutral and indifferent continuum. Can I participate in the meaningful, committed activities of others in a neutral way? Perhaps in the middle of the continuum we might find something like that, but wouldn't the continuum itself need to be graded with greater and lesser degrees of temporalizing meaning?

In other words, it is unclear how our social interactions can really be neutral. When Heidegger claims that Dasein lives in a world and that that world is a context of meaningful relationships, he thought that those relationships were charged with meaning. Many of the early lecture courses make it clear that, for Heidegger, average, everyday life had a kind of rich, intense meaningfulness. Can that meaning be neutral? Can Dasein-acknowledgment be neutral and indifferent? McMullin writes, for example, that there is a modally indifferent form of discourse: "The understanding found in discourse . . . is therefore a type of participation in the other's existence that can make available to him particular ways for him to be in the world -- authentic or inauthentic" (182). Such a discourse that was modally neutral, not yet either authentic or inauthentic -- what would it sound like? Even the most boring and indifferent person would speak in a language that was directed to some meaningful goal and that involved taking responsibility -- or refusing to take responsibility -- for their own having to be, as McMullin describes authenticity (216).

In Chapter 6, McMullin starts to hint at something like a Heideggerian ethics. Since Heidegger never wrote an ethics, these are troubled waters in Heideggerian scholarship, but McMullin goes about it the right way, for it is precisely in Heidegger's notion of being-with-others that we might find a sense of ethical responsibility. She writes:

Though Heidegger's characterization of the encounter with other Dasein as a type of originary limit on my temporal self-expression is still a far cry from a fully articulated sense of moral obligation . . . he characterizes the intersubjective encounter as an experience of always already having responded to the demand that I accommodate my temporalizing self-expression to that of another. (160)

At the end of the book, McMullin suggests that her work is designed to take account of "the entire range of human relationships, from murderous to loving" (233). She is right in her suggestion that murderers could acknowledge the claims and commitments of their victims and then still choose to violate them.

I do wonder, though, what McMullin would say about some form of evil that simply refused to acknowledge the existence of others at the most basic level. McMullin's key idea is that the modally indifferent continuum of originary time always involves some level of Dasein-acknowledgment. For McMullin, one might refuse to act in a way that is consistent with Dasein-acknowledgment, but "failing to meet this norm of appropriateness specific to our being-toward-others does not undermine the recognition of the other underlying it" (233). For her, there is always Dasein-acknowledgment. But is there a darker and more sinister evil that fundamentally refuses Dasein-acknowledgment? As Raimond Gaita claims in A Common Humanity, in order to treat someone either justly or unjustly, you must first recognize their humanity.[1] In so many instances, such as the relations of Australians to Aborigines, of early Europeans to Native Americans, and of Germans to Jews, that basic Dasein-acknowledgement simply seemed to be missing at certain points in time.

At the start of the book, McMullin makes the disclaimer that she is reading Heidegger as a transcendental phenomenologist and as a thinker who is "deeply indebted" to Husserl (13). In that vein, she describes, for example, "first-personal self-presence as a normative intentional directedness" (56), and she often employs terms like "subject," "intersubjectivity," "norms and standards of appropriateness," and "public norms and measures." Heidegger does not write this way, and he chooses his terms carefully, so some Heidegger scholars may bristle at McMullin's use of the language of transcendental phenomenology to describe Heidegger's ideas. But as original and creative as McMullin's account may be, it is also well-grounded in the relevant texts, and it could open up Heidegger's work to Husserlian phenomenologists interested in the ethics of social interaction or even to analytic philosophers working in these same areas. At times, though, her book reads as something of an apology for Husserl. There is no doubt that Heidegger owes a great debt to Husserl, but there are significant differences between the two thinkers, and these are well-documented. McMullin's suggestions throughout the book that Heidegger's work is an enrichment and fulfillment of Husserl's project elide those differences, in spite of the fact that, in important respects, the suggestions are undoubtedly the case.

At the end of the book, there is a marvelous example of authentic interaction. There are many interpreters of Heidegger's work who would claim that authentic Dasein is so silent, solipsistic, and self-absorbed that there could be no such thing as authentic interaction on his terms. But McMullin has made such a convincing case for a Heideggerian approach to intersubjectivity that we are prepared for the final chapter to make this case. She describes the attentive silence at work as she watches her young nephew try to tie his shoes. She is in a hurry to get home, and he would like her to help him, but she does not do so: "I do not leap-in and take over this careful struggle to be from him -- I hold myself back in a type of restraint that is nevertheless characterized by a hovering attentiveness, a silent co-willing, an expressive encouragement and recognition of his struggle" (227). This kind of active restraint could be expanded beyond the adult-child relationship to a broad range of authentic human interactions. Using Heidegger's texts, but employing a language that goes beyond Heidegger's own, McMullin has shown us a way to go about doing that.

In an article published in 1995, William Richardson challenged some astute phenomenologist to write about the implications of solicitude in Heidegger's work.[2] Irene McMullin has skillfully taken up that challenge.

[1] Raimond Gaita, A Common Humanity: Thinking about Love and Truth and Justice (London: Routledge, 2000, 2002).

[2] William Richardson, "Heidegger's Fall" in the American Catholic Philosophical Quarterly, Volume 69, Issue 2, Spring 1985, 229-253.