Time and Trauma: Thinking Through Heidegger in the Thirties

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Richard Polt, Time and Trauma: Thinking Through Heidegger in the Thirties, Rowman and Littlefield, 2019, 283pp., $135.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781786610492.

Reviewed by Thomas Sheehan, Stanford University


In the Anglophone world, few if any know the Heidegger of the 1930s better than Richard Polt. His co-translation of three Heidegger courses from that period, together with his major monograph on Heidegger's 1936-38 Beiträge zur Philosophie, have set a high bar for scholarship on the middle Heidegger and have made an indispensible contribution to it.[i]

With his latest book Polt gathers work he has done over the last ten years and brings it to bear on what he calls "the dark new philosophical landscape" of Heidegger in the 1930s. The result is four strongly argued chapters devoted to three distinct topics:

  • philosophy: Heidegger's shift of emphasis and direction in the 1930s (chapter 1);
  • politics: his disastrous involvement with Nazism, critically evaluated from an Arendtian perspective (chapters 2 and 3);
  • trauma: outlines of a "traumatic ontology," a heideggerisant reading of existence that takes seriously the experiences of emergency, crisis, and trauma (chapter 4 and Appendix).

As Polt reads him, soon after publishing Being and Time (1927), Heidegger found himself dissatisfied with how he had treated (or failed to treat) three topics: time, crisis, and sociality. Therefore, in the 1930s he shifted direction and drilled down on

  1. "inceptions of time," i.e., certain intense moments when human temporality itself arises, along with a conception of history focused on such inceptions;
  2. these inceptions as "moments of crisis or emergency," along with the claim that people today lack a sense of crisis;
  3. the issue of how a community -- a "we" -- is constituted, and in particular the German nation.

In short, questions of kairos, krisis, and polis:

  1. καιρός: intense moments when a new historical ἀρχή of existence becomes possible (cf. kairologische Momente, GA 63: 101.12).
  2. κρίσις: moments of crisis and decision, usually suppressed or ignored (cf. Sorglosigkeit: GA 63: 103.12).
  3. πόλις: the social and political, which were new topics in Heidegger's repertoire.

A text as rich and well-informed as this one resists easy summaries and, as I fully realize, requires a much more careful and complex discussion than a short review can provide. Polt once defined philosophy as "asking questions beyond the point where questioning usually stops."[ii] This volume lives up to that ideal and then takes it a step further. Like Heidegger himself, Polt intentionally raises more questions than he answers -- which makes the book an invitation to question yet further and to think outside the parameters of received Heideggerian wisdom, including the impressive and laudable wisdom of this volume.

Some readers will feel strongly drawn to the second and third chapters, which provide (1) a devastating critique of Heidegger's politics under Nazism, including brilliant summaries of six of his courses during the 1930s as well as an astute reading of his "Black Notebooks," and (2) a constructive Arendtian reading of the political, both in light of and against Heidegger. In what follows, however, I will focus on the more explicitly philosophical readings which are most clearly frontloaded in chapter one. The book is really three books gracefully fused into one: Heidegger's philosophical shift in the 1930s; his catastrophic political adventures; and the sketch of an existential phenomenology of crisis ("traumatic ontology"). In a brief review like this, I have to limit myself to a few remarks on only the first of those topics, under three headings.

1. Καιρός: The time of Ereignis.

Polt takes the proper meaning of "being" (Sein) to be "the clearing" (Lichtung), the field of finite intelligibility -- λόγος in its primary sense -- that human being is. He sees Heidegger in the 1930s shifting from the understanding of the clearing (Seinsverständnis) to the happening of the clearing (Seinsgeschehnis). Polt identifies this happening as "das Ereignis," an event that lies entirely in the future and hence has never yet been realized. And (1) since Ereignis is the very happening of the clearing and (2) since the clearing is what defines human being as Dasein, it follows that no human being has ever yet been Dasein. What's more, until the ancient Greeks began asking the question of being, no one really existed as human; and nowadays "only those human beings who live in the legacy of that [Greek] inception 'exist'" in Heidegger's sense of the term.

The suggestion that human beings did not truly "exist" before Greek philosophy -- that they were not being-there [Dasein] and did not have an understanding of being that transcends beings -- is a bizarre surprise for any reader of Being and Time. (p. 30; cf. p. 58)

Bizarre indeed. On this reading, Heidegger in the 1930s held that human beings today are living in a twilight zone of no-longer-Dasein/not-yet-Dasein, floating between a lost Golden Age when the Greeks began existing as Dasein and a future Golden Age when the Ereignis-event might let us once again become Dasein. But since Dasein is the "understanding of being that transcends beings" (cf. GA 9: 131), then contrary to everything Heidegger asserted before 1930, no one today understands the whatness and howness of things. (This, of course, would include the very Heidegger who makes that claim.)

But maybe things are not that stark. Along with Hölderlin, Heidegger holds that there are "peaks of time" (Gipfel der Zeit, GA 39: 52.22) that can be intimated by certain poets and thinkers. These are "inceptions, breakthroughs, or events of appropriation when a world is founded . . . they are so transformative that they inaugurate new domains where entities can be discovered" (p. 30-31)

Such καιρός-like moments allow for a new "inception of time" and hence a new ἀρχή (Anfang) for existence and being. But they happen only rarely (GA 69: 116.17) and apparently only for an elite few: poets like Hölderlin, thinkers like Heidegger, and political figures like Hitler. For them, the clearing does indeed happen, if only "at times" (GA 70: 15.21). At such intense kairological moments, it seems those elite few do become Dasein while the rest of us remain mere humans who are invited to follow their lead.

Temporality, in other words, gets transformed in the 1930s. It is no longer, as in Being and Time, "a fixed structure" that any person might realize at occasional moments of authentic resolve. Rather,

Heidegger now presents it as gushing forth at great historical moments that establish a way of existing for a people or an age. He has made the transition from the understanding of [the clearing] to the happening of [the clearing]. (p. 36)

We may defer for another time the question of whether there are contradictions among the claims (1) that the first inception of Dasein took place among the Greeks, (2) that no human beings have ever yet achieved the status of Dasein, and (3) that there are even now "peaks of time" when Dasein and the clearing happen.

2. Κρίσις: the emergency of the lack of emergency.

One of Polt's major contributions to scholarship on the middle Heidegger is the interpretation of Heidegger's technical term Not as "emergency."

There is no perfect English equivalent to the German word Not, but in many cases it could be translated as "emergency." For example, a Notausgang is an emergency exit, an exit that is to be used in cases or urgent need. In general, then, Not is a condition of emergency that arises at a particular juncture and creates a pressing need of distress" (p. 38f.)

Heidegger reads Not in three nuanced ways, namely as (1) a condition that is simply given with the sheer fact of being human, . . . a condition that (2) we can personally experience as a possible moment of decision, . . . but a condition that (3) unfortunately is mostly not experienced today or, if experienced, is avoided, ignored, or suppressed. That is, Heidegger's sense of Not contains three distinct senses of the Greek word κρίσις:

  1. the critical fact that defines us as human, viz., that we are inevitably needed if there is to be a clearing at all;
  2. the moment of possible decision in which we might choose to personally assume that neededness as our own;
  3. the current crisis of the widespread avoiding/ignoring/suppressing of both the critical fact and the moment of possible decision.

The first sense of κρίσις: As Polt carefully points out (p. 39f.), this critical fact that inevitably defines us as human -- the fact that we are needed (gebraucht) for there to be a clearing at all -- is our "innermost and most far-reaching neededness" (innersten und weitesten Not, GA 39: 113.12) and in fact the "highest gift" (höchste Schenkung, GA 45: 152.3-4) given to human being. This is neededness in its most fundamental sense (die große Not des Daseins, GA 94: 149.12; cf. 148:24). It is that by which human being is determined as Dasein.[iii] In Being and Time this would be called our "existential essence," our most basic way of existing.

The second sense of κρίσις: To personally experience that neededness is to feel our exposure to "excess," to our own mortal nothingness that both escapes and makes possible our ability to make sense of things (p. 38). This is a moment of inner terror at experiencing the fact of "the mystery . . . that gives Dasein its greatness" (GA 29/30: 244.32-33). In such a moment of crisis we are confronted with a decision (gestellt . . . in eine Entscheidung, GA 39: 146.31): either to embrace that fundamental neededness or to flee it.

The third sense of κρίσις: For Heidegger, the most obvious crisis of today is the absence of any awareness of κρίσις-1 (our fundamental neededness) and any experience of κρίσις-2 (moments of possible decision for our mortal neededness). This double absence is what Polt calls "the emergency of a lack of emergency." Whereas one can find similar sentiments in Being and Time (cf. its descriptions of fallenness and das Man), in the 1930s Heidegger brings it all to bear on social (and ultimately political) questions: how to awaken German society to κρίσις-1, then lead it to κρίσις-2, and thereby possibly help found an authentic "we" of the German Volk.

3. Πόλις: Forming an authentic German people

In Being and Time Heidegger is notoriously skimpy on positive discussions of the social dimensions of Dasein. He famously begins the body of the text with the resounding statement that "We ourselves are the entities to be investigated" but then privately scribbled in the margins "In each case [that means] 'I'" (SZ 41.29; GA 2: 56, note a). In turn, the mere twelve lines that he devoted to a community choosing its future (SZ § 74, 384.29ff) are quite thin and say nothing about how such a community might become authentic.

But in the 1930s that all changed. After his craven (and failed) attempt to put his philosophy at the service of the Führer both politically as rector of Freiburg University[iv] and academically in his courses of 1933-34, Heidegger foraged around in poetry -- notably Hölderlin's hymns and Sophocles' Antigone -- for help on the matter. Polt's masterful analyses of all these efforts and of the anti-Semitic sentiments Heidegger confined to his private notebooks, is brilliant and trenchant. It would take another review to cover this important part of the book. Those who are already familiar with Polt's previous publications on the topic will find here both a helpful synthesis and a fitting rounding out of his judicious readings of this dark decade.

* * * * * * * * * * * * * *

Finally, as I indicated above, this marvelous book intentionally leaves open some important questions about which doctores scinduntur, among them:

1. Is Ereignis an entirely future event and thus not yet operative? Or since Ereignis is the opening up of the clearing for sense (das Lichten der Lichtung, GA 12: 127.14-15), mustn't it be already operative (GA 12: 247.2-4) if there are in fact human beings who do make sense of things -- and who even argue that Ereignis is not yet operative?

2. And should Ereignis be called an "event" at all? -- given that Heidegger explicitly and repeatedly denied that it was (GA 11: 45.19-20; GA 12: 247.10; GA 14: 25.33-26.2; GA 70: 17.19; GA 98: 161.8 and 341.25).

3. Has no one ever yet been Dasein? Or is it rather that we both are -- and are not adequately -- Dasein ("Wir sind ja und sind doch nicht," GA 73.1: 278.11)? -- the way Aristotle might say we are indeed rational but quite often are "dislocated" (cf. ἄτοπον, 1178a3), i.e., not adequately rational.

4. Did Heidegger surrender the distinction of existentiel and existential in the 1930s (cf. p. 46)? If so, which of the two did he give up?

5. Is Dasein's existential structure a "fixed" essence and a "fixed" structure (pp. 27, 36)? Or is it the very becoming (SZ 199.15) that Dasein cannot not be?

6. Would Anfang be better read not as "inception" (ἀφορμή), a chronological starting point ante quod non -- e.g., ancient Greece, before which there was not Dasein -- but instead as a non-chronological ἀρχή, an existential-ontological source (GA 9: 247.11-14) that orders and sustains Dasein in its temporal-historical way of being? Thus it would be the case that Dasein, like the clearing, "does not begin . . . it originates" (GA 71: 147.14-16).

7. And regarding the social-political: Heidegger countered Marx's thesis (that philosophers have only interpreted the world whereas the point is to change it) by contesting the meaning of Welt (GA 16: 703.15-25). Interesting point. But given that Heidegger based his phenomenology on the particular, factical world we live in, when we know all that Heidegger knew about Welt, how does that affect the factical economic, social, and political worlds we live in today?

[i] His previous monograph on the period is The Emergency of Being: On Heidegger’s "Contributions to Philosophy" (2006). With Gregory Fried he has edited and translated Heidegger's courses Being and Truth (from 1933-34), Nature, History, State (from 1933-34), and Introduction to Metaphysics (from 1935). He is the author of Heidegger: An Introduction (1999) and editor, with Gregory Fried, of the series "New Heidegger Research" with Rowman and Littlefield International. (His secret pleasure is collecting typewriters. See his fascinating The Typewriter Revolution: A Typist's Companion for the 21st Century, 2015).

[ii] Richard Polt, "The Ereignis Interview".

[iii] "Der Mensch entspringt selbst erst aus dieser Not, die wesentlicher ist als er selbst, der nur und erst von ihr be-stimmt wird" (GA 45: 153.19-21).

[iv] . . . including his radio address of November 10, 1933, calling the German people as a whole to choose "their own Dasein" in a moment of ersatz authenticity—by voting to leave the League of Nations (GA 16: 188f.)