Time Biases: A Theory of Rational Planning and Personal Persistence

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Meghan Sullivan, Time Biases: A Theory of Rational Planning and Personal Persistence, Oxford University Press, 2018, 197pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198812845.

Reviewed by Tim Campbell, Institute for Futures Studies, Stockholm


Meghan Sullivan's book defends temporal neutrality -- the thesis that prudential rationality requires indifference about when events are scheduled. Most of us fail to live up to this standard because we are time-biased -- we have systematic preferences for when events happen. For example, we are near-biased -- all else equal, we care less about what is good or bad for us the further into the future it will happen. We are also future-biased -- we care less about a good or bad experience if it's past. Thus, we want our bad experiences to be over and done with, and our good experiences to lie ahead.

Sullivan argues that time-bias is irrational and detrimental to our planning practices. According to her, rationality requires having preferences based appropriately on reasons, and there is no good reason to care about when events are scheduled. Her book offers a unified explanation of the irrationality of all time-biases, seeks to explain their origins, and suggests some heuristics to help overcome them. It also includes illuminating discussions of the meaning of life, and of how one should feel about the prospect of an afterlife. The writing is exceptionally clear, and Sullivan engages readers with a mix of realistic vignettes and actual cases, many autobiographical, and all relating to issues that many of us will inevitably deal with: saving for retirement, planning sabbaticals, caring for an ailing loved one, etc. In addition, she relates the material in each chapter to the views of one or more important historical figures in philosophy, literature, or science, thus giving readers a sense of the enduring nature, and scope, of the practical questions that the book grapples with. Chapters 1-4 focus mainly on near-bias, Chapters 5-7 on future-bias, Chapter 8 on the origins of our time-biases, and Chapters 9-11 on practical implications of temporal neutrality.

Sullivan's case for temporal neutrality relies largely on two principles:

The Success Principle: At any given time, a rational agent prefers that her life going forward go as well as possible. (p. 22)

The Non-Arbitrariness Principle: At any given time, a prudentially rational agent's preferences are insensitive to arbitrary differences. (p. 36)

Sullivan uses these principles in several arguments throughout the book. The first, in Chapter 2, is against near-bias. Near-biased agents sometimes prefer present, lesser goods to greater, future goods. But getting these lesser goods means that their lives going forward will be worse than if they had instead received the greater goods. They violate the Success Principle.

Chapter 3 defends an argument against near-bias that appeals to the Non-Arbitrariness Principle. The preferences of near-biased agents are sensitive to when an event is scheduled relative to the present. But, Sullivan argues, relative distance from the present is an arbitrary difference between events. So near-biased agents violate the Non-Arbitrariness Principle. 'Arbitrary differences' is characterized in terms of reasons. If a difference between x and y doesn't provide a prudential reason to prefer x to y, then this difference is arbitrary with respect to prudential rationality. Sullivan suggests that the Non-Arbitrariness Principle explains the irrationality of many of the cognitive biases studied in behavioral economics, such as the endowment effect -- the inclination to prefer objects more, or less, depending on whether or not one has owned them for a time (a seemingly arbitrary distinction).

Chapter 4 considers and rejects an argument for the rational permissibility of near-bias based on personal volatility or the range of a person's variation over time. People vary over time in many ways; their personalities, goals, and bodies change, for example. Personal volatility might provide a basis for near-bias. For example, suppose that personal volatility increases with relative distance from the present (e.g., the greater the temporal distance between one's present self and a future self, the greater the psychological and physical difference between one's present self and that future self). Then those who discount based on increased personal volatility -- what Sullivan calls personal discounting -- will systematically prefer earlier goods to later ones.

Much of Sullivan's discussion of personal discounting focuses on the view, inspired by Derek Parfit, that rational egoistic (i.e. prudential) concern tracks psychological connectedness, "the holding of particular direct psychological connections", as "when a belief, or a desire, [or a memory], or any other psychological feature continues to be had".[1] This view offers a possible justification for personal discounting. But Sullivan rejects it. Her argument rests on intuitions about cases. One involves an extroverted and stressed-out lawyer, Jonathan, who goes on a meditative retreat where he becomes quiet-minded and pacific and focuses only on his breathing and bodily movements (63). Sullivan's intuition is that Jonathan before the retreat doesn't have diminished reason to be prudentially concerned about Jonathan during the retreat. Yet, this case doesn't clearly challenge the Parfit-inspired view. Perhaps Jonathan has a quiet-minded disposition that is manifested only in stimulus conditions provided by the retreat. That wouldn't imply diminishment of psychological connectedness between Jonathan's extroverted self and his quiet-minded self, since psychological dispositions can persist while they aren't being manifested. On the other hand, if there is diminished connectedness -- if Jonathan's psychology is rewired -- then personal discounting may not seem like such an irrational response. Is the extroverted lawyer rationally required to care just as much about a future self that lacks all his current goals and intentions?

Sullivan also proposes The Moral Valence Hypothesis: we have diminished egoistic concern for any selves who are psychologically dissimilar or causally disconnected from our present self only if those selves have perceived diminished moral capacity or diminished social/moral worth (p. 64). Sullivan argues for this hypothesis by citing empirical studies in which subjects consider instances of radical psychological change. In one study, when the individual after a radical change was described as having morally worse behavior than the individual prior to the change, subjects seemed to agree more strongly that the former and latter were not the same person. It is unclear to what extent this study supports the Moral Valence Hypothesis, since the subjects weren't asked anything about egoistic concern. However, one could argue that the subjects' judgments about personal identity strongly indicate corresponding judgments of diminished egoistic concern.

Chapters 5-7 argue that future-bias is irrational. Sullivan notes that unlike our near-bias, our future-bias often involves absolute discounting of past pains and pleasures; we assign them zero value. Chapter 6 argues against absolute past-discounting. Sullivan defends Weak Forecasting: given certain relevant information, it is permissible for you to prefer any option you know you will never regret to one you know you will eventually regret (p. 95). She shows that if Weak Forecasting is true, absolute past-discounting has absurd implications. For example, suppose you must choose between having 10 units of pleasure now and having 1 unit of pleasure in the future, and if you choose to have the 10 now, your choice and your pleasure will coincide temporally. If you discount the past absolutely, then if you choose the 10 units now, you will immediately discount them since they will lie in your past. You will then regret not having chosen the 1 unit since, if you had, there would still be some pleasure coming to you. But if you choose the 1 future unit over the 10 present units, you will never regret it, since, relative to each time after your choice, it will be true that if you had instead chosen the 10 units, they would be in your past and would be discounted. So, if you discount the past absolutely, you will prefer the 1 unit to the 10. But this preference seems crazy; we should reject absolute past-discounting.

Chapter 7 employs the Non-Arbitrariness Principle once again, this time in an argument against future-bias. Sullivan argues that being past rather than future is a prudentially arbitrary difference. She considers and rejects several candidate justifications for future-bias, including those based on observed asymmetries in our past-directed and future-directed emotions and attachments.

Chapter 8 offers an account of why our time-biases are so persistent. Sullivan defends the evolved emotional heuristic model for temporal discounting (p. 123). For our evolutionary ancestors, it was useful to care mostly about what was within their control. Far future events were much less within their control than near future and present events; and past events were completely outside their control. Those who had stronger emotional reactions toward immediate future events, as opposed to temporally distant and past events, were more likely to survive and pass on their genes. A major selling point of the evolved emotional heuristic model is that it explains an apparent asymmetry: we tend to be future-biased when considering our own self-interest but temporally-neutral when considering the interests of others. For example, when we focus on ourselves, we feel more stressed about future unpleasant experiences than about past ones, but when thinking about someone else, we feel the same amount of stress about their future and past unpleasant experiences (p. 124). If the evolved emotional heuristic model is true, this is to be expected since, generally speaking, one has much control over one's own future, but little or no control over others' futures.

Chapter 9 considers whether it is irrational to consult past preferences when deciding whether to complete projects. Those who do this commit the sunk cost fallacy. Sullivan argues that honoring sunk costs is irrational when it involves sticking with options that one has forsworn or that one will regret (p. 137). Otherwise, she thinks, it is sometimes rationally permissible to honor sunk costs as a means of following through on a plan that one has rationally chosen to adopt. Chapter 10 considers whether one can rationally prefer that one survive through radical change rather than cease to exist. It focuses mainly on the radical change of transitioning into an infinite afterlife. Sullivan acknowledges that one's afterlife may be radically different from one's earthly existence, and she approaches the subject of the afterlife with an appropriate balance of sobriety and humor:

On most Christian accounts, we will get new unalterable bodies. We may or may not have free will. We may or may not have families. It is strongly suggested that there will be a lot of hymn singing. One could be forgiven for not being excited about moving on into this state. (p. 153)

Sullivan invokes the Success Principle as well as a version of Weak Forecasting: you may be rationally permitted to prefer the afterlife to your annihilation if you would always affirm or be indifferent toward the afterlife and wouldn't always affirm or be indifferent toward your annihilation.

But would you always affirm or be indifferent toward the afterlife? Bernard Williams and Samuel Scheffler claim that "you should always prefer death to an infinite afterlife", since "there will inevitably come a point in any sufficiently long life when you should prefer to reach an end, since you will inevitably run out of projects worth valuing" (p. 162). Sullivan argues that this claim rests on the dubious presupposition that the ways we get value in the infinite afterlife are similar to the ways we get value in our finite lives. She considers and rejects a widely-discussed argument by L.A. Paul for the claim that one cannot rationally choose an option if one cannot anticipate what the resulting outcome will be like "from the inside". Here, Sullivan appeals to an impartial spectator test. When one imagines an impartial spectator choosing on behalf of some individual (not excluding the possibility that this individual is one's self), the relevant question is whether the outcome of one's choice will be worthwhile for that individual, not whether one can accurately imagine what the individuals' experiences will be like "from the inside".

Chapter 11 considers a surprisingly influential argument for the claim that life is meaningless. The argument appeals to The Permanence Principle: one's life has meaning only if one's activities make a permanent difference in the world -- permanent in that their influence stretches infinitely into the future (p. 169). But, the argument continues, nothing one does makes such a difference; hence one's life is meaningless. Sullivan scrutinizes responses to the argument by William Lane Craig and Richard Taylor before defending her own proposal. According to Sullivan, the appeal of the Permanence Principle is due to future-bias. If we accept temporal neutrality, we should see no reason to accept the principle.

While many of Sullivan's arguments for temporal neutrality are compelling, there is an apparent tension between her two main principles -- the Success Principle and the Non-Arbitrariness Principle. In some cases, the former requires preferring an option with a better future while the latter implies that such a preference is arbitrary (assuming arbitrariness of the past-future distinction). To see this, consider an example of Parfit's that Sullivan discusses in a different context. Suppose you are a hospital patient. You have lost your short-term memory and have no indication of the current date and time. All you know is this: either you will have a short operation tomorrow that will cause you to suffer for one hour, or you had a very long operation yesterday that caused you to suffer for 10 hours. Having the long operation is much worse than having the short operation. If you were scheduled to have the long operation, then there is no more surgery in your future -- you will check out of the hospital later today. If you were scheduled to have the short operation, then while you haven't yet had any surgery, you will have the short surgery tomorrow -- so there is still some suffering coming to you. The Success Principle requires that you prefer the outcome in which your life going forward will go best. That means you should prefer that you had the long operation yesterday, since in that case, your life going forward will be better than if your short operation is still to come.

But if, as Sullivan believes, the past-future distinction is arbitrary, then the Non-Arbitrariness Principle requires that you prefer that you have the short operation tomorrow. That way, your life as a whole contains less suffering -- regardless of whether this suffering is past or future. To resolve this tension, the Success Principle can be restated as follows: At any given time, a rational agent prefers that her life as a whole go as well as possible. This seems to do the same work as the Sullivan's forward-looking formulation, but it is compatible with the Non-Arbitrariness Principle. While stating the principle in forward-looking terms may avoid begging the question against those who are future-biased, ultimately, the temporally neutral formulation stated above seems more in line with Sullivan's project.

The book will be of interest to anyone wishing to gain a deeper philosophical and scientific understanding of their own patterns of prudential concern and planning behavior, as well as bigger questions concerning life, death, and meaning. The book is well-argued, and stylistically, it is a welcome departure from the dryness that is characteristic of much of analytic philosophy.


Funding from the Riksbankens Jubileumsfond is gratefully acknowledged.

[1] Parfit, Derek, Reasons and Persons, New York: Oxford University Press, 1984, p. 205.