Time, Chance, and Reduction: Philosophical Aspects of Statistical Mechanics

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Gerhard Ernst and Andreas Hüttemann (eds.), Time, Chance, and Reduction: Philosophical Aspects of Statistical Mechanics, Cambridge UP, 2010, 211pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521884013.

Reviewed by David Albert, Columbia University


The first thing to say is that one comes away from this collection with the impression that the conversation about the foundations of statistical mechanics is still very much in its infancy: there seems to be no stable and general consensus among the investigators represented here even about how some of the basic statistical-mechanical terminology is to be understood, or about what the central foundational problems of statistical mechanics are, or about what might or might not count as solving them.[1]

Consider (for example) the problem of the arrow, or arrows, of time. Claus Kiefer begins his essay "Quantum gravity and the arrow of time" by identifying the main such arrows as follows:

· The preponderance of outgoing over incoming radiation

· The increase of entropy dictated by the second law of thermodynamics

· The quantum-mechanical measurement process, and the emergence of classical properties

· The expansion of the universe and the emergence of structure by gravitational condensation

But this list will strike many investigators as almost perversely incomplete. What about the fact that (for example) the sorts of things that we can find out about the past are radically different from the sorts of things we can find out about the future? And what about the fact that the means we find we need to employ in order to find out about the past are radically different from the means we find we need to employ in order to find out about the future? And what about the fact that by acting now we can apparently affect the future but not the past?

If Professor Kiefer thinks that these time-asymmetries of knowledge and intervention are somehow not physical, or somehow not susceptible of physical explanation, or if (on the contrary) he thinks that they follow from the straightforwardly physical time-asymmetries already on his list by so obvious and so familiar a route as not to warrant separate and individual attention, then he is wrong -- and (indeed) the necessity and the non-triviality of explaining these asymmetries as mechanical phenomena of nature turns out to be the central preoccupation of the opening essay in this collection, an excellent piece by Mathias Frisch (of which more later) called "Does a low-entropy constraint prevent us from influencing the past?".

There are, of course, a number of very important temporal asymmetries that Professor Kiefer does mention in his essay -- but his discussion of these asymmetries is impaired by what seems to be a misunderstanding about what some of them actually amount to.

Take (for example) the second law of thermodynamics. The particular variety of entropy whose decrease is prohibited by that law has to do with exchanges of heat among macroscopic physical systems. The particular variety of entropy whose decrease is prohibited by that law is a function of macroscopic physical variables like temperature and pressure and volume. And it is among the principal tasks of statistical mechanics to provide an interpretation of that particular variety of entropy -- the entropy (that is) that we run into in thermodynamics -- in terms of the exact microscopic physical conditions of the individual particulate constituents of the macroscopic systems that thermodynamics treats. And it was among the principal achievements of Boltzmann to have given us an interpretation like that.

There are other entropies floating around in the scientific literature -- there is (for example) an entropy due to Shannon, which has to do with the mathematical theory of information, and there is an entropy due to von Neumann, which is a measure of the purity of Quantum-Mechanical states -- which are referred to as 'entropies' in virtue of an abstract, formal, mathematical resemblance which they bear to the entropy of Boltzmann, and which (unlike Boltzmann's entropy) have nothing directly to do with the entropy we encounter in thermodynamics.[2] And the failure to keep these various different entropies clearly distinct, or the explicit thought that they are somehow equivalent, or some more psychologically complicated combination of the two, has generated veritable oceans of wasted ink over the years.

And there is some such confusion, it seems to me, in Professor Kiefer's discussion of the microscopic underpinnings of the second law, which appeals not to the entropy of Boltzmann, but to the thermodynamically irrelevant entropy of von Neumann.

And I have no idea what to make of the apparently serious and straight-faced consideration that Jos Uffink gives, in his essay on "Irreversibility in stochastic dynamics", to coarse-graining and interventionist accounts of the approach to thermodynamic equilibrium. I had thought we were done with all that years ago. I had thought that everybody who had given this business any serious consideration had long since agreed that if the exact fundamental laws of the time-evolution of the entirety of the physical world are exactly symmetric under time-reversal, then it can contribute nothing whatever to a foundational discussion of the phenomenon of irreversibility (it can amount, at best, to a not particularly interesting mathematical curiosity) to point out that there are course-grained approximations to those laws that happen to lack that symmetry. And I had thought that everybody who had given this business any serious consideration had long since agreed that if the exact fundamental laws of the time-evolution of the entirety of the physical world are exactly symmetric under time-reversal, then it can contribute nothing whatever to a foundational discussion of the phenomenon of irreversibility (again, it can amount, at best, to a not particularly interesting mathematical curiosity) to point out that there are useful practical techniques for guessing at the behaviors of relatively well isolated sub-systems of the world, in the absence of detailed knowledge of the environments of those sub-systems, that happen to lack that symmetry.[3]

And I was puzzled, in a similar vein, by Robert Batterman's emphasis, in his very learned essay on "Reduction and renormalization", on the exactness of the reduction of thermodynamics to statistical mechanics in the limit as the number of particles in the system under consideration goes to infinity. What sort of foundational or philosophical good does it do us, exactly, to be told that there is a certain undisputed falsehood about thermodynamic systems (that such systems consist of infinite numbers of particles) such that if it were true, then the truth of thermodynamics would follow from that of statistical mechanics?

Thermodynamics (to begin with) isn't true -- it is merely, and in a very complicated sense, approximately so. And what we want, or should want, from an account of the relationship between thermodynamics and the true underlying fundamental laws of physics, is not anything along the lines of a derivation, but (rather) a way of making it clear to ourselves that the class of natural phenomena to which thermodynamics usefully applies, that the class of natural phenomena of which thermodynamics amounts to a relatively accurate summary, can be given a complete and exact account in terms of the laws of statistical mechanics. And from this point of view, it is not of the slightest interest, on the face of it, whether or not there happen to be patently unphysical limits in which these two 'theories' exactly coincide. The project of microscopic understanding could presumably proceed just as well (couldn't it?) if no such limit existed -- if statistical mechanics, in that limit, somehow simply broke down, or made no sense, or behaved oddly.

That having been said, there are a number of essays in this volume that focus with considerable precision and imagination on what strike me as genuine and well-posed and important and still unsolved problems.

There is (to begin with) the Mathias Frisch piece that I mentioned above. Professor Frisch's essay is a clear and accessible summary, and (more importantly) an incisive and well-reasoned critique, of a proposed mechanical account -- due to Barry Loewer and myself -- of the fact that what we do now can apparently influence the future but not the past. I hope to have the opportunity to give Professor Frisch's essay the careful and detailed consideration it deserves in another place -- let it suffice, for the moment, and for whatever it may be worth, to say that I have learned a great deal from the business of thinking Professor Frisch's objections through, and that I suspect that, at the end of the day, they can be successfully answered.

And there is a very helpful piece called "The past-hypothesis meets gravity", by Craig Callender, which rightly emphasizes the enormous megalomaniacal ambition of the Boltzmannian understanding of Statistical Mechanics -- particularly as it has been elaborated in books like Time and Chance -- and presents (with considerable sobriety and intelligence) some of the many obstacles that a program like Boltzmann's is going to need to overcome. I suspect that Professor Callender may be slightly overestimating the seriousness of some of those obstacles, and that he may be slightly underestimating the generality and the flexibility of core idea of Boltzmann's program -- but these are minor quibbles, and the proof (of course) will be in the pudding.

And there is, finally, an interesting trio of essays on the philosophical analysis of probability -- but even here, there seems to be no general consensus as to what the interesting options are.[4]

Jacob Rosenthal (for example) in his essay on "The natural-range conception of probability" dismisses frequentist conceptions of probability without ever mentioning the one that (in so far as I understand the matter) has by far the widest contemporary allegiance among philosophers -- the one which is embedded in Lewis' 'Best-System' conception of natural law, and which has been developed, over the last ten years or so, by Barry Loewer.

Michael Esfeld, in his essay on "Humean metaphysics versus a metaphysics of powers", provides an admirably clear and concise summary of the controversy referred to in his title, and then comes down decisively on the side of a robust metaphysics of powers -- and (more particularly) of a propensitist conception of chance. What's puzzling -- particularly in light of the explicit topic of the book in which his essay appears -- is that he makes no mention whatever of the chances in statistical mechanics. Indeed, he sometimes writes as if chances can only come up, as if chances can only present themselves, in the absence of determinism. And this (it needs to be said) is no small omission -- since it is precisely the business of making sense of chances in deterministic theories like statistical mechanics that is widely regarded as the most obvious, urgent, and serious challenge to conceptions of chance as some sort of primitive dynamical tendency.[5]

Roman Frigg, in his piece on "Probability in Boltzmannian statistical mechanics" focuses with considerable clarity and precision on the question of defining 'fit' for the Lewis-Loewer account of probability. Professor Frigg raises indisputably important and difficult problems here -- but I'm more optimistic than he is about the ultimate possibilities of solving them. Humean conceptions of probability have always seemed to me -- much more so (apparently) than they seem to Professor Frigg -- to be a deeply pragmatic business. And what the Humean probabilities need to fit -- according to this pragmatic understanding -- are (very crudely) the patterns that are important to us. And if one keeps that at the center of one's attention, many of the worries raised by Professor Frigg seem, at least, to recede.[6]

[1] I have a dog (by the way) in any number of the controversies which are taken up in the essays in this book. Indeed, several of these essays respond quite explicitly to a way of understanding the foundations of statistical mechanics that Barry Loewer and I have been writing about for several years now -- and even the title of this collection (which is "Time, Chance, and Reduction", italics in the original) seems to allude to an earlier book of my own called Time and Chance. The reader is invited to take these remarks (then) with as many grains of salt as she thinks fit.

[2] The reader who is familiar with the definitions of these various different entropies will have no trouble at all (for example) writing down a pair of exact possible microconditions of a gas -- call them A and B -- each of which has perfectly well-defined values of both thermodynamic and von Neumann entropy, and such that the thermodynamic entropy of B is higher than that of A and the von Neumann entropy of A is higher than that of B.

[3] There is, in fact, at least one serious proposal in the literature -- the so-called GRW theory of the collapse of the quantum-mechanical wave-function -- according to which the exact fundamental laws of the time-evolution of the entirety of the physical world are genuinely stochastic. And there are good reasons to suppose that the GRW theory, if it should turn out to be true, would indeed provide an altogether different and in many ways more satisfactory account of the approach to thermodynamic equilibrium than the one we have from traditional statistical mechanics. But of this, for reasons I cannot understand, Professor Uffink makes no mention whatever.

[4] I am leaving altogether out of account here -- not because it does not merit talking about, but (rather) because I feel altogether unqualified to talk about it -- a fascinating historical essay by C. Ulises Moulines called "The crystallization of Clausis's phenomenological thermodynamics".

[5] Professor Esfeld also strikes me as much too glib in his dismissal of Russell's famous 1912 critique of the very idea of causation. He says (for example) that "one can conceive charge, for instance, as the power to build up an electromagnetic field". But this is simply not true. The electromagnetic field, on the Maxwellian account, is not determined by the charge-distribution, or even by the complete history of the charge distribution. Period. End of story. Russell's critique applies to Maxwellian Electromagnetism in precisely the same way, insofar as I can see, as it applies to Newtonian Mechanics.

[6] Professor Frigg seems to think, by the way, that the Lewis-Loewer program somehow overlooks the role of the Hamiltonian -- and here he is simply and explicitly mistaken. Speaking for myself -- and I am certain that precisely the same applies to Barry Loewer, and I am nearly certain that the same applied to David Lewis -- whenever I speak, in this context, of (say) 'The Newtonian Laws of Motion', I am (of course!) referring not just to F=ma, but to the full equations of motion, whose solutions take the form of particular trajectories in phase-space.