Time for Aristotle

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Ursula Coope, Time for Aristotle, Oxford University Press, 2005, 208pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199247900

Reviewed by Andrea Falcon, Concordia University


Time for Aristotle is a beautifully concise and clear study of an exceedingly difficult section of the Physics: Aristotle's discussion of time (Physics IV 10-14). Ursula Coope not only explicates Aristotle's obscure and often elliptical account of time; she also forcefully defends this account by showing how it depends ultimately on Aristotle's idiosyncratic conception of the natural world. Aristotle is concerned with problems and questions that are different from those that may motivate the investigation of a modern philosopher. But this does not mean that we cannot learn from Aristotle's discussion of time. Quite the contrary: Coope thinks that we can learn a lot about the theoretical concerns that motivate our investigation of time if only we approach Aristotle's text with the right frame of mind. It is indeed time for Aristotle if we are open to the possibilities of his philosophy and don't foreclose any of them by assuming that he has to provide an answer to our questions.

Aristotle conceives of the natural world as the realm of change: everything that is natural is subject to change (change is here to be understood in its broader sense, including qualitative and quantitative change as well as change in place). Although Aristotle thinks that change and time are intimately related, he explains time in terms of change and not vice versa. He obviously thinks that the notion of change is more fundamental in his explanatory project. This helps us to understand why Aristotle's first and overriding concern in the Physics is to secure a general account of change; that is, an account that can apply to change in all its manifestations. This account makes no reference, implicit or explicit, to time. Only when this account is firmly in place does Aristotle develop a number of notions essential for his philosophy of nature, including that of time. On the interpretation favored by Coope, however, Aristotle could have assumed that change is something dependent on time, since he believes that there is no change without time. The fact that he does not assume this calls for an explanation. But there is no such explanation in the Physics or elsewhere.

Perhaps the explanatory benefits resulting from the reverse assumption, that time is something dependent on change, can be taken as an indirect argument for the assumption itself. Coope shows how fruitful this strategy is in dealing with certain structural features of time. Aristotle is committed to the view that there is time when the mind (I should say the soul) is aware that the instants of time are two. Moreover, he claims that between two instants of time there can always be another instant of time. In other words, Aristotle believes that time is continuous. But his contention is that time has this structure because change does. Moreover, change has this structure because magnitude does: between any two points on a line there can always be another point. In this case the direction of the explanation is obviously from magnitude to change and from change to time. Aristotle offers a non-temporal explanation of the before and after in time along the same lines. He argues that the before and after in time depends upon the before and after in change, which in its turn depends upon the before and after in place. It is very tempting for us to read Aristotle's discussion of the before and after of time as an attempt to deal with an issue that is central in the philosophy of time: temporal asymmetry. Coope suggests that Aristotle's goal may be significantly more modest: to establish that time is a certain type of order.[1] To understand fully what Coope means we have to see how she reads Aristotle's definition of time.

Aristotle defines time as a kind of number. More precisely, time is "a number of change with respect to the before and after" (219 b 1-2). Coope argues that in defining time as a kind of number Aristotle defines it as something that is essentially countable. On her reading, time gets counted by counting instants of time. Moreover, when we count an instant of time, we mark a potential division in all the changes that are then going on. Counting instants of time turns out to be a way of arranging all the changes that are going on in a single before and after series. Coope carves out her interpretation by discussing an alternative reading of Aristotle's definition of time. According to this other interpretation time is something that is essentially measurable. Coope does not deny that time is measurable, but she contends that measurability is not the defining feature of time. Coope argues that Aristotle's use of "number" (arithmos) rather than "measure" (metron) in his definition of time is quite deliberate. It is by focusing on the fact that counting is a way of ordering that Coope arrives at the idea that time as it is understood by Aristotle is a type of order.

A somewhat surprising consequence of Aristotle's definition of time is the claim that time is dependent upon a mind which can count (I should say a soul which can count). For Aristotle the dependence of time upon the mind (the soul) implies that there would be no time without beings that are able to count. But this does not extend to change despite the fact that time and change are intimately connected. Coope focuses on the different way in which time and change relate to the mind (the soul). It follows from the definition of time that time cannot exist in the absence of beings that are able to count because time is defined as something that can be counted. But it does not follow from the definition of change that change depends upon beings that are able to count. Remember that the definition of change is carefully crafted to make no reference, implicit or explicit, to time. In other words, time is essentially countable, whereas change is not. But this is consistent with the claim that there is no change without time and there is no time without change.

Another somewhat surprising consequence of Aristotle's discussion of time is the claim that things that last forever are not in time. This claim is particularly puzzling when we realize that the things that Aristotle has in mind are the heavenly bodies. For Aristotle these bodies are constantly changing from one place to another in virtue of the fact that they are forever in motion around the earth. By claiming that these bodies are constantly changing in place and asserting that they are not in time Aristotle seems to deny the intimate relation that he himself has established between time and change. Coope does a very good job in explaining how the claim that the heavenly bodies fail to be in time does not entail that they are not part of the temporal order. Quite the contrary: to count an instant of time is to mark a potential division in all the changes that are going on, including the changes that are going on in the heavens. The heavenly bodies are therefore in certain temporal relations with the things of the sublunary world. For example, they stand in a relation of simultaneity with other things: they perform their characteristic circular motion while other things in the sublunary world undergo other changes. But the heavenly bodies are not in time because they are not surrounded by time; that is, there is not a time before and after their characteristic motion. Moreover, they are not in time because their total motion cannot be measured by time. One gets the impression that Aristotle is using the conceptual resources developed in the discussion of time to distinguish between two modes of being. On the interpretation favored by Coope, this is what Aristotle is trying to do by saying that being in time is not equivalent to being when time is. If this is right, Aristotle thinks that only the things that come into existence and go out of existence are, strictly speaking, in time. These things are in time because there is a time before they come into existence and there is a time after they go out of existence. Since they last for a finite length of time, this length of time is measurable. By contrast, the heavenly bodies are not in time; they are when time is in the sense that they are part of the temporal order and as such stand in certain temporal relations with the other things of the natural world.

Coope develops an important, insightful, forcefully characterized interpretation of Aristotle's discussion of time. The great intrinsic value of this interpretation lies in the attempt to show how this discussion fits within the explanatory project that Aristotle carries out in the Physics. Coope is able to show that Aristotle's discussion of time is not just a collection of loosely connected notes on the topic of time but a comprehensive and coherent account of the phenomenon of time. For all these reasons I think that Coope has produced a lasting contribution to the growing field of studies on Aristotle's philosophy of nature.

[1] But Coope goes on to offer an alternative (and by her own admission speculative) interpretation of the text which gives Aristotle something to say on the issue of temporal asymmetry. For this alternative interpretation, see pp. 72-81.