Time in Feminist Phenomenology

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Christina Schües, Dorothea E. Olkowski, and Helen A. Fielding (eds.), Time in Feminist Phenomenology, Indiana University Press, 2011, 196pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780253223142.

Reviewed by Lanei M. Rodemeyer, Duquesne University


Time in Feminist Phenomenology provides several insights regarding this topic. First, it shows the importance of analyzing time and feminist phenomenology together, not only because very little has been done to combine the two areas, but also because they -- although seemingly exclusive of one another -- actually touch on one another in essential ways at several different levels. Second, it displays the wide variety of possible approaches possible to the topic. From rigorous phenomenological work that examines essential structures from a Husserlian viewpoint, to Merleau-Pontean examinations of the sexual body in its motility and its environment, to Ricoeur's discussion of the narration of the self studied through a phenomenological and feminist lens, to Arendtian analyses of the polis as both historical and gendered, the authors provide a broad selection of inquiries under this seemingly narrow heading. Finally, the volume reveals precisely how difficult it is to bring these two areas together -- which may be one reason for the dearth of good work on the topic so far (other than a few exceptions). While for the most part successful in bridging the sizeable gap between analyses of time and work in feminism, the authors themselves admit that there is much to overcome in bringing these two topics together. Nevertheless, in spite of the effort required, it is clear that the work is valuable for the phenomenology of time and feminist phenomenology.

Olkowski launches the anthology with her "Prologue: The Origin of Time, The Origin of Philosophy". In a lyrical style, Olkowski weaves through the mythical story of Kore (Persephone), daughter of Demeter, who was stolen away by Hades as she played amongst the flowers in a field. While this myth tells the reason for the cycle of the seasons -- as Kore spends part of the year with her mother and the other part with Hades -- Olkowski recognizes that this myth also symbolizes a philosophical move toward order and a focus on the sense of vision. She compares this to the earlier myth about Eurynome, "both the Goddess of All Things from whom all things emerge and the transformative, dynamic element, the creative element, setting the cosmos in motion and impelling it toward change." (25) The Platonic move toward order, eternity, and light -- as opposed to Eurynome's twilight of the moon -- gave philosophy a very specific direction at the moment of its origins, a direction Olkowski calls into question.

Part 1, which centers on the phenomenology of time taken up through feminist and gender theories, begins with Sara Heinämaa's "Personality, Anonymity, and Sexual Difference: The Temporal Formation of the Transcendental Ego". With rigor, Heinämaa argues that the notion of sexual difference is essential already at the level of Husserl's transcendental person, and not just at the empirical level, for which the transcendental level is the constituting ground. Citing both published texts and manuscripts by Husserl, Heinämaa demonstrates that habituation enables an historical Gestaltung of the transcendental person, and that "the transcendental person is essentially a temporal formation". (46) Heinämaa then responds to the critical argument that Merleau-Ponty's discussion of the anonymity of sense perception is a rejection of Husserl's notion of subjectivity as voluntaristic. Instead, Heinämaa argues, the anonymous level of subjectivity put forth by Merleau-Ponty is already included in Husserl's notion of the transcendental person. In this way, gender -- and even anthropological history -- is already established at the transcendental level in phenomenology.

Schües takes on several (possibly too many) tasks in her "The Power of Time: Temporal Experiences and A-temporal Thinking?" First, she works through the basics of Husserl's phenomenology of inner time-consciousness in order to explicate that "(a) time constitution presumes an embodied self, and (b) the self is temporalized by its ongoing activities in the world." (65) Next, she discusses how this individual, temporal subject is integrated into a community of subjects, and how socialization can de-center and de-present the individual. This makes possible the imposition of power on the individual, in the sense that the reciprocal relation of temporality and subjectivity can be disturbed. Finally, Schües argues that reflective thinking is a type of inner dialogue that requires leisure time, and thus, the social control of leisure time can ultimately lead to the impoverishment of the subject.

In "Gender and Anonymous Temporality", Silvia Stoller begins with a citation from filmmaker Maya Deren, in which Deren claims that women have a different sense of temporality than men on the basis of their reproductive capabilities. While Stoller agrees that there are gendered differences in our experiences of time, she takes issue with the biological basis of Deren's claims. Instead, Stoller points out that both biological and cultural factors can lead to gendered temporal differences, although neither of these does so necessarily. Further, she recognizes that the hint of biological essentialism in Deren's position is fraught with difficulties. Stoller then takes up the notion of anonymity in Merleau-Ponty, which he discusses primarily in relation to sexuality, but which she also sees as applicable to temporality. Referring to arguments she developed elsewhere, Stoller explains that anonymous sexuality is a "surplus" that grounds the manifestation of sexual difference. Given that, she argues, "anonymous temporality is a latent sphere of temporality that underlies the different time experiences of genders." (86-7) This anonymous temporality can be found more concretely in the different perspectives of the subject, the object, and in the social realm. In addition, it enables gendered experiences of time beyond the presumed distinction of man and woman.

Linda Fisher begins "Gendering Embodied Memory" by addressing the specter of the supposed incompatibility of phenomenology and feminism. Fisher introduces the concept of "gender" and its history in feminist philosophy.  She then, in arguing that there is an irreducible aspect to gender, asserts that gender is a proper subject of phenomenology, both through phenomenological analyses of gender and through the "gendering of phenomenological analyses". (96) Fisher next carefully works through Merleau-Ponty's notion of the body's motility, turning to his understanding of habit and embodied memory to show the depth of the meaningful body. This embodied memory, however, implicates gender, and Fisher argues that the modality of gender in embodied memory deserves further investigation. Finally, she offers an example from her own experience of gendered embodied memory, a phenomenological instance that demonstrates the intertwining of habitualized memories and gendered experiences.

Ricoeur seems an unlikely candidate in an anthology focusing on feminist phenomenology, but Annemie Halsema provides a compelling synthesis of time, phenomenology, and feminist inquiry in "The Time of the Self: A Feminist Reflection on Ricoeur's Notion of Narrative Identity". Halsema begins with a review of Ricoeur's notion of the narrative self, as defined by both the idem (the "what am I?" or the sense of sameness) and the ipse (the "who am I?" or the sense of self), as well as the interplay of concordance and discordance in the telling of one's life narrative. She then turns to the issue of the body, and Ricoeur's critical appropriation of Husserl's notions of Körper and Leib, explaining that "Ricoeur . . . claims that being Körper is as much part of selfhood as being Leib, and that the first is no less primordial than the latter." (119) Given this, Halsema claims that "understanding embodiment explicitly as being a body among other bodies" (119) opens up interesting issues for feminist analysis. Her final sections addresses these by taking up Irigaray's and Butler's critiques of Ricoeur's notion of the embodied narrative self. These feminist critiques enable Halsema to argue that the social, narrative body is also gendered and limited, through the fundamental experiences of sexual difference and the cultural mediation of our "own" narratives.

Part 2 turns to political and ethical questions of gender and time. Arendt is another figure who would seem improbable to include in this volume, but Veronica Vasterling ("Contingency, Newness, and Freedom: Arendt's Recovery of the Temporal Condition of Politics") offers a careful, textually grounded argument that Arendt's work -- in her methods, sources, and content -- contains "an existential and hermeneutic phenomenological signature." (136) Vasterling then explicates Arendt's flipping of the hierarchy of contingency and necessity, such that contingency is no longer the counter position to necessity, nor the less valued position. Rather, contingency becomes for Arendt the foundation for human reality, and necessity is opposed by freedom rather than contingency. The latter is the more interesting point for Vasterling who points out, "the interruptions of the linear time sequence of human life may be experienced as freedom" -- a freedom that arises only when the discontinuities in life are "new beginnings" (140-1). She then describes what qualifies as a "new beginning", making clear that neither the unpredictable nor what is ascribed to "free will" is sufficient to enable such new interruptions in the human time line. Finally, Vasterling suggests that Arendt's criticisms of philosophy and the sciences is a recognition that such institutions foreclose many possibilities for new beginnings and thus for freedom.

In "Questioning 'Homeland' through Yael Bartana's Wild Seeds", Fielding offers a sensuous review of Bartana's video artwork as bodily, erotically inviting and politically, meaningfully critical. Bartana integrates temporality into her video pieces, Fielding argues, not only through how they are viewed, but also in her choice of contemporary issues for subject matter and in the very technical, material way that the pieces are created. The main piece described, Wild Seeds, demonstrates a game played by teenagers in Israel that mimics the protest of Palestinian settlers against Israeli soldiers. In doing so, Fielding argues, it employs the use of haptic vision and sound, drawing the viewer into the game in an embodied sense. Employing Merleau-Ponty, she analyzes how the piece not only creates a visceral experience, but also implicitly criticizes our presumption of the connection between sensory input and meaning while also displaying the teenagers' critical attitude of the Israeli military position. Finally, with the use of Arendt, Fielding argues that there is "an inherent temporal dimension to the political; it is action that is, in fact, inter-action". The polis, then, is "revealed as embodied intermittent relations" that ground it as both temporal and spatial. (166)

Gail Weiss concludes the volume with "Sharing Time across Unshared Horizons." She begins by asking how we might be able to communicate with one another despite major differences in how we experience our shared spatial and temporal community. Turning to Bergon and Schutz as a way to explicate the "outer time" that we share, perhaps in our "working world", Weiss then challenges -- along with Rosemarie Garland Thompson, a leading disability theorist -- the presumption that our very inclusion in a bodily shared space would give us insight into one another's experiences. She then turns to Linda Alcoff's Visible Identities as a way to analyze the importance of identity while respecting the necessity of fundamental experiential differences. While critical of Alcoff's privileging of visible markers, especially in the case of racial and gendered identities (as opposed to religious or ethnic identities), Weiss agrees with Alcoff's description of identity as an "interpretive horizon", arguing that this interpretation "enables us to explore the possibilities available to us to transform our own identities, our own horizons, and thereby the very meaning of our experiences, through our interactions with others." (183)

For the most part, Time in Feminist Phenomenology contains tight, well-written essays.  They all address the question of time and feminist phenomenology, each from its own perspective. The volume is a valuable contribution to both the phenomenology of time and feminist phenomenology, offering careful textual interpretation as well as original. It was a pleasure for this reviewer to read, and it will be a useful reference for future work in these areas.