Time in the Philosophy of Gabriel Marcel

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Helen Tattam, Time in the Philosophy of Gabriel Marcel, Modern Humanities Research Association, 2013, 220pp., $14.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781907322846.

Reviewed by Jill Graper Hernandez, University of Texas at San Antonio


Absent from the canon of work done on time are contributions from French existentialist Gabriel Marcel (1889-1973). For those unfamiliar with Marcel's thought, the absence might seem trivial: perhaps time is not something existentialists are known to write seriously about, favoring instead talk of our lived-experiences as bodies. For those acquainted with Marcel, the inattention paid to Marcel's conception of time cannot be taken as a slight -- 'time' just does not seem to be a main theme in his work. Or, so I thought, prior to reading the first monograph ever written that is dedicated to Marcel's philosophy of time.

As it turns out, Helen Tattam provides a thesis that fundamentally ties Marcel's undisputed central themes -- presence, intersubjectivity, hope, freedom, and reflection -- into his view of timeTattam's book paints Marcel as an "unplaced" philosopher of time, unsystematic (certainly), though largely misunderstood in his analysis of time and how it compares to those of his contemporaries, especially Bergson, Ricœur, and Lévinas. For Tattam, Marcel's existential ideas are better grasped when "lived human experience is not a one-dimensional succession of discrete events; [since] its many facets are all lived at once, intermingled to the extent of indissociability in the complex flux of la duree" (19).[1] Of course, the project of placing Marcel as a thinker who productively adds to the dialogue on time is difficult, since "the theme of time is not explicitly discussed by Marcel at length, nor in general by other commentators of his work" (6).

Tattam takes what Marcel does say about time (contextualized within the existential landscape Marcel explicates), thinks about the relationships Marcel had with philosophers of time who influenced his work, and then makes some philosophically interesting inferences. The result is five possible interpretations of Marcelian 'time' (each forming a chapter): ontologically (a Bergsonian take wherein human reality has a temporal dynamic, an immediacy, grounded in the here and now (18)); phenomenologically (that captures the existential tension between time and eternity -- that temporal constraint of human mortality and an individual's need to transcend it, given her inability to conceive of a world without her presence (60-61, 66)); as narrative (an attempt, like Ricœur's, to mitigate the aporias that stem from thinking about 'time' by the mediation of narrative, in which "human time is always conceived and articulated, for it enables one to make impersonal ontological time one's own" (87)); as Lévinasian (Marcel and Lévinas share the view that the Self's relation to time "equally serves as a model for its relation to the Other" (119)); and as Augustinian (Marcel shares with Augustine religious commitments such that, any concern with time is philosophical, but also reflects and is bound to a form of eternal Being -- the Being of God (160)).

Tattam does not defend any of these equally-fascinating interpretations over the others (the one tangible mark that this book is a version of a doctoral dissertation). This minor complaint is partly offset by the strong reasons she does offer for rejecting each. The most obvious take on Marcel's conception of time is the first position introduced, i.e., that it was inherited from his philosophical father, Bergson. Tattam shows, however, that Marcel ultimately rejected Bergson's notion of eternity in favor of an understanding of the consciousness of reality as a progression (31). As a philosopher of the concrete, Marcel would be drawn to a phenomenological view of time that is both contingent and inconsequential (le temps) as well fluid, valuable, and tied to the lives of others (éternité (63)). But, Tattam ends up faulting such a read of Marcel because he fails "to recognize the intimate link between the question of time and the question of Being. Time may not exist as an entirely separate ontological . . . object from human reality . . . but this does not mean that it can be considered without reference to ontology" (81). The construal of Marcelian time as Lévinasian draws unusual philosophical support from Marcel's theatre pieces. Tattam argues that the methodological shift in presentation from philosophy to theatre (a shift, it should be noted, that is not chronologically borne out in Marcel, since he wrote philosophy simultaneously with his dramatic, literary, musical, and political pieces) "could be interpreted as a kind of Lévinassian move away from traditional, totalizing metaphysics, in order to engage ethically with the lived, intersubjective time of reality" (125). Both Lévinas and Marcel realize "the uncertainty and ambiguity of temporality cannot be escaped, for these are what actually define human experiences of normativity and intersubjectivity" (144), and yet, Tattam rejects a Lévinassian view of Marcelian time on the basis that Marcel is "unable to escape the lure of eternalizing narrative, unable to face up to the unsettling instability of time" (145).

The closest Tattam gets to hinting at her own view is during her assessment in the last chapter, which juxtaposes Augustinian time against Marcel's contrast between temporal human worldliness and God's immutable, eternal being. "Owing to the fact that the past is no longer, the future not yet, and the present only an ephemeral 'now'" (162), Tattam suggests that Augustine reserves non-existence for temporal beings like us, and that Marcel similarly thinks of human temporal succession as that which "tends toward non-existence" (162). Marcel and Augustine share a presentation of time that is "ontologically subordinate to, and an epistemological distraction from, authentic eternal Being -- which may be identified with God" (162). Marcel refuses, however, to use religious authority to justify his arguments and hesitates, even, to precisely draw out the meaning of divine transcendence (a crucial component to divine eternality and our human relation to it). So Tattamconcludes that God cannot be essential to the transcendent eternity for which Marcel argues (176). Following her rejection of the Augustinian interpretation, Tattampresents something of an original idea -- that Marcel has a personal view of time distinct from his professional view. Marcel's religious commitments compel him to write (especially in his diary, published as Metaphysical Journal), giving 'eternity' an Augustinian flavor, so that "the reality of time is subordinated to a more authentic immutable presence" (183). But, the general tenor of Marcel's sense of time, from Tattam's perspective, does not hierarchically separate time and eternity. Instead, she continues,

Marcel's discussion of time with eternity stems primarily from the desire to recognize transcendence itself, the significance of which is recovered through temporal phenomenological analysis, not beyond it . . . eternity is not atemporal but is rather bound up with time, as the transcendent otherness that shatters the self-sufficient identity of immanence. (183)

Her suggestion offers philosophical insight that steps away from the messiness of Marcel and says something important that adds to the literature on Marcel.

The best moment of the book is Chapter 3, in which Tattam frames the Marcel-Ricœurian notion of time as a "phenomenologico-hermeneutic reading" wherein "time and eternity are both part of the structure of human temporality" (100). What sets this chapter apart is that it takes what is superlative about Marcel's philosophy (his notion, for example, of personal identity, or of how to account for "my life"), Ricœur's philosophy (the 'emplotment' of temporal order that introduces a necessity which unifies contingency), and marries them in a narrative structure of personal identity that acts "as a transcendent mediator between the tensions of unity and difference (eternity and time) that I experience in myself" (98). If time is to become "mine" for Ricœur, I have to create a narrative of myself that "does more than just establish humanity, along with human actions and passions 'in' time," it also must "recollect it" (101). For Marcel, secondary reflection is the same dynamic, creative act that must be performed in order "for it to be possible to grasp the significance of my life over and above chronology, over and above my life as understood through primary reflection" (101). The phenomenologico-hermeneutic interpretation of time makes, Tattam argues, narrative the key to a unified notion of identity over time, since narrative is fundamental to an individual's experience of the self, and to a grasp of time and eternity.

Although this interpretation of time rings truest among all of those the book offers, to my ears, it suffers the same fate as the other four Tattam discusses. The main flaw she finds with this perspective runs along a common thread in the book -- Marcel's view of eternity commits him to understanding an individual's narrative as a smoothed-out whole, rather than really philosophically engaging with "the threat of tension and uncertainty" (110) that comes with time. Rather, Tattam argues, narrative time should both anticipate the future and recall the past in relation to the present moment, so that the future and past are only ever understood now, and never as significant in themselves. Even more, depicting Marcel's time as phenomenologico-hermeneutic would lead Marcel to a "betrayal" of his own view, since he writes that time is irreducibly mulitplicitous, and, occasionally, broken (ruptures and temps morts (111)). And so, Tattam abandons all interpretations of Marceliantime.

It is unclear that the views of unsystematic philosophers who offer relational pictures of the world ought to be systematized by others, and even more, that they ought to be criticized when they don't fit into a dialectical mode of thought. Although Tattam reminds the reader at several points that Marcel fought against an abstract method of philosophy, there are moments when she does attempt to fit his views into a system and then faults him when those attempts fall short. The best example of this is in Chapter 2. Tattam constructs a diagram that depicts the "progress" of being "up this pente, from mere existence toward être -- Being proper" (62). The "pente de l'existence" model exhibits a horizontal axis (le temporel, aspects of an embodied life) that intersects with the vertical (l'éternel, an ascension of being) at the point of freedom. She argues that Marcel's hedging between existence and être has the consequence that "a rigid binary is instituted between the ontologically authentic and inauthentic" (63) -- an odd assertion given the model she just provided showing a gradational view of freedom and ontological authenticity. She then complains that, "Marcel's terminology lacks rigor, obscuring matters further than is warranted; and his philosophical language is particularly nebulous where time and eternity are concerned" (70).

Putting aside the seeming incongruity of valuing a philosopher's thought for resisting disjunctive classification and then rejecting the view for it, the pull to locate Marcel's metaphysics in a binary fashion ought to be avoided. That isn't just good general pragmatic advice -- since attempts to do so will frustrate those who want to be true to Marcel's texts -- but would have been usefully remembered for Tattam's project specifically. For example, when she enters the fray over whether Marcel's phenomenology and ontology are strictly distinct with regard to the fact of existence (a binary that can be set aside when evaluating Marcel's oft-equivocal metaphysics), Tattam stumbles into questions that she is unable to successfully tie to Marcel's view of time. These include short discussions of ethics, phenomenology of experience, love, personal identity, the relationship between philosophy and theology, etc, throughout each chapter. In moments, Tattam seems aware that these side issues permeate the book. She notes:

This reveals the extent to which questions of time have a bearing on the very possibilities of philosophy itself, for not only do philosophical positions affect how time is understood; how one understands time (already) affects one's understanding of the task and scope of philosophy. (194)

My concern with the book's engagement with other issues is the degree to which those other issues really are guided by the theme of time. Very good work has been done in the past decade on Marcel's metaphysics, epistemology, and ethics, so this book could have been uniquely positioned to tie each of those crucial Marcelian themes to the concept of time. Instead, such little space is devoted to these side areas, without tying them into (what is meant to be) the guiding theme of time, the effect is distracting. For example, from discussing Marcel's equivocation between existence and être, Tattam means to transition to ethics by saying, "The other major complication regarding the status of Marcel's philosophy is the ethical concern that his arguments also appear to convey" (68). She spends exactly one more paragraph discussing intersubjectivity and ethics (a crucial tie, certainly, in any exegesis of Marcelian ethics) before ending with, "in other contexts Marcel asserts that the role of philosophy is one of 'explication,'" and picking up the next paragraph with "Time and eternity are not exempt from such difficulties" (70). It is a minor curiosity that only two paragraphs are spent on ethics here, but the stronger problem is that those two paragraphs appear to be arbitrarily sandwiched into a treatment of transcendence and eternity.

One more worry: on the back cover, the book is characterized as an "account of Marcel's engagement with the problem of time." Cover material typically is not source material for a review, but in this case, it creates an opportunity to address a difficulty Tattam identifies. If 'time' is a central Marcelian tenet -- one that importantly informs how we relate with each other -- to characterize time as a 'problem' is itself problematic. 'Problems,' on Marcel's account, indicate the objective (rather than intersubjective) way the self relates to itself and others. Although Tattam refers to the distinction between problem and mystery (most effectively when she nicely integrates the distinction with love (57-9)), she never discusses time in relationship to the problematic. This is a missed opportunity. She asks but does not answer, "how is one to interpret Marcel's argument for the transcendence of time in favor of eternity?" (70). But, earlier, Tattam hints at a resolution. If the Marcel passage she briefly references is correct -- "time is referred to as a form of 'tentation' -- a term that is also identified with the desire to 'convertir le mystère en problem,'" -- then the struggle we experience against our own deaths (and so, against our own mortality) can be properly categorized as a Marcelian problem, whereas the presence we have with each other that is not bound by our death would, indeed, best be called "mysterious." We have a conception of eternity (something mysterious, and uncertain) even though we cannot conceive of our own death (a problem, and certain).

[1] Readers should take note that none of the primary text references -- and there are many -- are translated. A strong grasp of French would benefit all who take up the book. This does disqualify it as an option for many students, but would be excellent source material for doctoral students, especially, working on Continental material.