Time Travel: Probability and Impossibility

Time Travel Probability And Impossibility

Nikk Effingham, Time Travel: Probability and Impossibility, Oxford University Press, 2020, 243pp., $77.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198842507.

Reviewed by Kristie Miller, University of Sydney


Nikk Effingham’s book is an exploration of all things time travel (where time travel is to be read as backwards time travel, that is, travel to an earlier time). There’s a lot in the book, and this review only barely scratches the surface. If you are interested in time travel, then this book is an absolute must. It’s packed full of great stuff. Even if you aren’t particularly interested in time travel per se, this book should still be of interest. Though it is written entirely through the lens of worrying about issues pertaining to time travel, it contains a number of proposals that are interesting in their own right. These include, but are by no means limited to:

  1. An account that identifies external time with the personal time of the universe and hence offers a reduction of time to (immanent) causation between regions of space.
  2. An account of abilities on which (in some contexts) it’s true that we have the ability to do that which is metaphysically impossible.
  3. An account of physical possibility on which some physical possibilities are metaphysically impossible.
  4. An account of chance on which some metaphysical impossibilities have non-zero chance (even though we should assign them credence zero).
  5. An account of decision theory on which in time travel Newcomb cases we should do the analogue of one-boxing, which, in turn, makes it rational for us all to avoid travelling in time even if we were able, in order to avoid some kind of cataclysmic disaster.

(a) is an independently interesting view about the nature of time. The idea, roughly, is that what makes a dimension a temporal dimension is that it is the dimension along which regions propel themselves, through immanent causation. Immanent causation is typically contrasted with transeunt causation. Where transeunt causation obtains between two distinct events (or objects or states of affairs) and involves distinct continuants, immanent causation obtains between the same continuant. So we can think of immanent causation as what happens when the state of a continuant at one time brings into being the state of that continuant at another time.

This view gives us a reduction of temporal direction (the direction of time) to immanent causal relations obtaining between a region at one time and that region at a later time. Does this rule out backwards causation (that is, causation in which the cause is temporally after the effect)? No. That is because objects or events located at one region can bear causal relations to objects or events located at earlier regions. So the causal arrows that obtain between things in time can come to point in a different direction to the arrow of time itself.

Indeed, it seems as though one feature of this proposal (which may not be an attractive feature) is that the ‘true’ direction of time can completely come apart from the direction of physical processes in time. All around us we see physical processes as having a direction: entropy increases towards the future; we have records of the past, but not the future; eggs rot and ice melts. The directedness of these processes is usually thought to be connected, in some way or other, to the arrow (i.e., the direction) of time. But on the current proposal (as far as I can see), it could be that in our world the true arrow of time (given by the direction of immanent causation between regions at one time and regions at another time) points in the opposite direction to the apparent arrow of time: the arrow that we see when we look at the physical processes around us. Insofar as we hoped that the arrow of time (if there is one that is not simply reducible to the ‘arrow’ of physical processes) explains why processes have, or appear to have, a direction, this proposal might leave something to be desired. Nevertheless, it’s a proposal to which it is well worth attending.

Turning to (b), it should be no surprise that the book devotes a significant amount of time to the grandfather paradox. So-called paradoxers offer the grandfather paradox to show that time travel is metaphysically impossible. Roughly, the idea is this. Suppose Freddie travels back in time to a time prior to when his grandfather sired his father. Now suppose that Freddie tries to kill his grandfather. Freddie is strong, young, well-armed, and is generally perfectly able to kill people. So it seems as though Freddie is able to kill his grandfather. Yet were Freddie to succeed in killing his grandfather, he would bring it about that his father, and in turn he, is never born and never comes into existence. But Freddie cannot both exist and not exist, and his grandfather cannot be both alive and not alive. Since Freddie can succeed in killing his grandfather if he travels back in time, it must be that in fact Freddie cannot travel back in time.

There is a lot to like about Effingham’s discussion of the grandfather paradox. There is a nice overview of the connection between some of the scientific conjectures put forward in this area and what philosophers have had to say about the paradox. There is also an introduction of a dialetheist solution. Dialetheism is the view that at least some contradictions obtain: some propositions are both true and not true. So the dialetheist can resolve the grandfather paradox in a way that preserves the metaphysical possibility of time travel, by arguing that when you travel back in time you bring it about that your grandfather is both dead and not dead. It’s nice to see this view spelled out, though in the end as Effingham notes it is not so very different from certain indexed non-Ludovician models of time travel. Non-Ludovician models of time travel are those in which time travel occurs in something other than a standard block universe world (in which past, present, and future are equally time, and there is no objective present that moves). Lewis’s classic account of time travel is Ludovician (which is why the view is so-named). Non-Ludovician models are those in which time travel occurs in dynamical worlds (where time passes in virtue of there being some set of events that are objectively present, and where which events those are, changes). The introduction of dynamism into a model of time travel raises all sorts of difficulties (and interests) precisely because it opens up questions about whether time travel somehow involves ‘unwinding’ time itself. Indexed models are those that posit some additional index against which a moment of time can be indexed. These might include positing hypertime (a second temporal dimension) or other branches of the universe. In either case, we can ask how things are at some time (say t2) at different hypertimes, or at different universes, or at different branches of a universe. This opens up the possibility that t2 is different at one index from how it is at a different index.

Dialetheist solutions to the grandfather paradox end up looking a lot like indexed models of time travel because the dialetheist had better not say that live grandfather can interact with dead grandfather. So, in some good sense the two sets of facts have to be ‘separated out’. But that looks a lot like a view on which at the relevant time, grandfather is dead at one index and alive at another.

The book defends the view that time travel is metaphysically possible. In this regard, it’s sailing the sea of philosophical orthodoxy. But it does so by defending what Effingham calls impossability theory—so-called because it denies the Poss-Ability thesis: If (in circumstance C) an agent, A, can φ, then there’s a metaphysically possible world at which A φ’s in C. So impossability theory is, roughly, the view that the state of affairs of killing one’s own grandfather (at some relevant past time) is metaphysically impossible, but it is metaphysically possible for someone to have the ability to bring that state of affairs about.

The view begins with the familiar idea (from Lewis (1976)) that ‘can’ has different meanings in different contexts. So when we say that we can do something, we might mean that we can (metaphysical possibility) do it, or that we can (physical possibility) do it, and so on. Then the idea is that the principle that captures this feature of ‘can’ of our abilities is not the Poss-Ability principle, but the following revised Poss-Ability principle: If (in circumstance C) an agent A can φ, then there’s a world in which A φ’s in C. This revised principle leaves open that the world in question at which one φ’s may not be metaphysically possible.

This brings us to the idea (c) that some physical possibilities are metaphysically impossible. This might make your head spin. We usually think of physical possibilities as a proper sub-set of metaphysical possibilities; we think that they are those worlds that share the same metaphysical and nomic laws as our world. Effingham argues against such a view. Here’s the motivation. Think, again, about what we can do. What motivates the grandfather paradox is the idea that in some good sense it looks like we can kill grandfather: we have what it takes, there is nothing, nomically speaking, that speaks against our succeeding. Killing someone in the kind of circumstance in which we find grandfather is well within the laws of nature. So when we are focussing on the lack of a physical impediment to killing grandfather, we are focussing on there being some physically possible world in which we kill grandfather. To make sense of this, we should hold that there are physically possible worlds like this, even though they are metaphysically impossible (since it is not metaphysically possible to kill grandfather).

Accepting both of the claims in (b) and (c) resolves the grandfather paradox. That paradox relies on something like the following claim: if I were in the correct circumstances, I could kill grandfather. The thought is that if time travel were possible, then I could be in the correct circumstances, and then I could kill grandfather. But that would lead to a contradiction, since grandfather did not die at that time and so if I kill him, he will be both dead (having been killed) and alive (in order to father my mother and hence indirectly me).

To see how the paradox is resolved, consider the two ways we might think about the ‘could’ claim here. We might be in a context in which we are focussing on the fact that in those circumstances, there would be no physical impediment to my killing grandfather. In this sense, I could kill him. This should strike you as reminiscent of Lewis’s (1976) view. However, the view is rather different. For according to the impossability view, ‘if I were in the correct circumstances, I could kill grandfather’ comes out as true when we evaluate it using the revised Poss-Ability thesis. I do have the ability to kill grandfather, since there is some physically possible world in which, in those circumstances, I succeed in killing him. (This, of course, is not what Lewis claims.) But this being so is no threat to the possibility of time travel, since the world in which I succeed in doing so is not metaphysically impossible. Now instead suppose we focus on the sense in which I cannot kill grandfather. In this context, ‘if I were in the correct circumstances, I could kill grandfather’ is false. For in this context, we are interested in the fact that if I were to try and kill grandfather, then I would in fact fail. We are interested only in the metaphysically possible worlds. Since there are no such worlds in which I succeed in killing grandfather, by the revised Poss-Ability thesis this comes out as false. But, again, that is compatible with time travel being metaphysically possible. So whichever context we are in, ‘if I were in the correct circumstances, I could kill grandfather’ presents no problem for the metaphysical possibility of time travel.

The book then moves on to give a very detailed and thoughtful examination of the probability of time travel, conditional on us accepting impossability theory. There is a lot in this section of the book, and those interested in probability, chance, credence, and decision theory more generally should have a lot of fun here. In the context of impossability theory (d) probably no longer strikes you as quite peculiar as it might have at first. After all, if some metaphysical impossibilities are physically possible, then we might expect them nevertheless to have a non-zero chance (after all, they’re physically possible). Perhaps more interestingly, the book defends the idea that the chance of some state of affairs occurring (in a time travel world) is the same as the chance of a qualitatively similar state of affairs in a qualitatively similar circumstance in which there is no time travel. Given this more specific claim about chance, it’s clear why some metaphysically impossible states of affairs have a non-zero chance. For instance, killing grandfather has a non-zero chance: the particular state of affairs of killing him in some particular manner, in a particular circumstance, has the same chance as the chance of bringing about a qualitatively similar state of affairs in a qualitatively similar circumstance: and that is surely non-zero. Nevertheless, given that killing grandfather is metaphysically impossible, we should give it credence zero. After all, we know it won’t happen.

The book also argues for a number of interesting upshots for decision theory (e). I’ll leave those for the reader to investigate. These upshots, however, lead to the idea that we should avoid time travel even if we know how to do it. The reasoning is roughly this. We know that there are not a lot of time travellers around here, just as I know that I will not kill grandfather. Consider grandfather. Suppose I plan to just keep travelling back in time and trying to kill grandfather. Something must prevent me from doing so each time. But jointly, these events have low chance. Likewise, if we have access to time machines, then it is unlikely that each of us will for some reason decide not to travel to this time, or that each of our machines will stop working (and so on). It is much more likely that a single (still low chance) event will bring it about that I do not travel back to kill my grandfather, and another single low chance event will prevent all of us from using our time machines. So if I am planning to go back and repeatedly try to kill grandfather, what is most likely is that I suffer a devastating heart attack, or that I am murdered, and so on, rather than that each time I try, some different event prevents his death. Similarly, if we all had access to time machines, then it is most likely that there is some cataclysmic event (nuclear war, detonation of the sun) that prevents all of us from using them. And, given the upshots for decision theory, Effingham argues that we should decide not to travel back in time, because in doing so we avoid bringing about any of those cataclysmic events.

In addition to defending (a) through (d) the book covers some familiar terrain, albeit in a particularly engaging and rigorous fashion.

First, can we change the past? Although the book is primarily interested in Ludovician time travel, it also takes up the question of whether, in non-Ludovician worlds, it makes sense to say that we can change the past. Here, Effingham sides with those I will call past-changers, and against those who claim that in such worlds you are merely ‘avoiding’ the past, or creating a new past, not changing the old one. Since the arguments presented on both sides here are fairly familiar, I won’t rehearse them again here.

Second, Effingham takes up the question of whether we can make sense of time travel of the Ludovician kind in worlds with an open future (that is, worlds in which future contingents are indeterminate). While the book doesn’t seek to show that time travel in such worlds is impossible, it does argue that friends of the open future are unlikely to embrace Ludovician time travel. Suppose it’s t5 now and a bullet appears. Suppose it’s indeterminate whether, at t10, a gun is fired into a time machine and sent backwards in time to t5. Effingham argues that if the laws of nature rule out bullets appearing ex nihilo, then the future in which the gun is not fired at t10 in the machine is physically impossible. So it is physically necessary that the gun is fired at t10. Since many advocates of the open future take that view to involve indeterminism being true, they will not be happy to learn that the firing of the gun is physically necessitated (even if metaphysically open).

It’s worth noting, here, that the friend of the open future (and indeterminism) could reject the idea that it’s nomically necessary that bullets do not appear ex nihilo. Indeed, they could say that highly improbable events such as the forming of matter at t5 into a bullet-shaped object are not counter-nomic (even given the actual laws of nature) though they are of course highly unlikely. What is happening is that the event, at t5, of the bullet appearing is the causal product of earlier highly improbable indeterministic processes. If, at t10, the bullet is fired into the time machine, then it will turn out that this firing is an over-determining cause of the bullet being located at t5 (also improbable, but not counter-nomic) and the bullet will be a time traveller. If, at t10, the bullet is not fired into the machine, then the appearance of the bullet is just one of those unlikely chancy events that are not associated with time travel. So while the fit between Ludovician time travel and the open future is not, perhaps, a particularly nice one, it’s not yet obvious that the open future theorist has to say that the relevant future (in which the bullet is fired) is nomically necessary.

Regardless, the book proceeds to give a very nice overview of the various different kinds of non-Ludovician time travel. Since there has been quite a bit of work on this kind of time travel over the last few years, this is a very welcome section of the book that provides a very useful taxonomy and conceptual framework for thinking about these different kinds of time travel. Indeed, the book also attempts to demystify hypertime by, first, defining bi-temporality (the having of more than one temporal dimension in a world) and then providing an account of the conditions under which a bi-temporal world is a world with hypertime. This proposal, too, is a nice addition to this literature.

All in all, there’s a tonne to like about this book (and much that I have not discussed here). I recommend it to young and old alike.


Lewis, D. (1976). “The paradoxes of time travel”. American Philosophical Quarterly 13:145-152.