Time, Will, and Purpose: Living Ideas from the Philosophy of Josiah Royce

Placeholder book cover

Randall E. Auxier, Time, Will, and Purpose: Living Ideas from the Philosophy of Josiah Royce, Open Court, 2013, 424pp., $59.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780812696783.

Reviewed by Roger Ward, Georgetown College


Josiah Royce shows up as a rather occult figure in the shadow cast by the classical American philosophers, Peirce, James and Dewey. Royce is often mistaken as an Hegelian, or as a protégé of James who buries himself in idealism and late in his career adopts Peirce's semiotic logic to resolve the problem of the Absolute. For these reasons and more Royce is often overlooked as a creative, systematic, and vital philosopher. Randall Auxier's brilliant historical and philosophical account of Royce comes packaged in a lively and sometimes caustic account that sets such easy categorizations on their ear.

Auxier's goal is two-fold: to present Royce's genuine philosophical position and to focus on his "living ideas" that should shape our philosophical landscape. The book works, in my estimation, in accomplishing both of these goals. Along the way it reveals gems of the American philosophical tradition hidden by neglect or complexity. Auxier weaves a narrative of Royce's philosophical progression that has legs and heart; legs that carry analysis from the historical origins of ideas directly into present reflection on the business, politics, and profession of philosophy, and heart that shows in the reflective interchanges among friends and the personal and religious dimensions of suffering and hope. Auxier lauds good thinkers and lambasts the purveyors of errors and misguided reflection, particularly those in the analytic tradition and fellow pragmatists who tend toward hero-worship of James or Peirce (whom he likens to finicky cats). He is fresh, but in an entertaining way.

The entertainment factor, however, is purposeful in carrying the reader beyond the recovery of Royce to consider the demands of a systematically coherent philosophy. There are hints about Auxier's own position: a process oriented pragmatic personalism with overtones of theistic idealism, but that is not the subject in view. Further, Auxier confronts philosophers with this interpretation of Royce as a call to take up their responsibility to the world to engage in offering conceptualizations of even such difficult ideals as community, individuals, and God. (128)

The provenance of our largely mistaken perception of Royce traces back to one of the finest of our clan, John E. Smith, whose summary of Royce was taken as an explanation of the whole of his thought, forming a "bottle-neck" in the interpretation of his thought. Smith misses the early influence of Peirce on Royce, an error he could have avoided if he had asked the right people. The collection of Smith's misleading ideas effectively forced Royce's personalism out of the picture despite that it "screams for recognition" in all of his writing. (28) This is the error Auxier intends to correct.

Auxier enters into the task straight forwardly in Chapter 1 ("Biography") relating Royce's intellectual lineage to Nietzsche, as the thinking of each emerges from the overlapping and clashing of Schopenhauer and Emerson. (30) He traces Royce's education in Germany, where his focus shifted from Romanticism to neo-Kantianism, to his time in 1877 with James, which began one of the most important exchanges in the history of American thought. (37)

Although biographers connect Royce's intellectual formation to his birth and childhood in California, Auxier points out that Royce desired to leave there bcause he observed that, although California was an opportunity to achieve the beloved community, it represented rather a fall into "selfish and blind egoism." (41) A debate with George Holmes Howison over the Conception of God on a visit to Berkeley focused Royce on the need for a better description of individuality. This occasioned his development in The World and the Individual of a four-fold account of ontology as realism, mysticism, critical rationalism (qualified knowledge claims about being) and the Fourth Conception of Being, which is "to be is to be uniquely related to a whole." (46) The logic in this argument is triadic, apparently following Royce's encounter with Peirce's 1898 lectures.

The second series of The World and the Individual temporalizes these conclusions, showing that "will reflects the inner dynamism that reaches beyond itself into a possible future and acts upon an acknowledged past." (47) Realism is an error of taking these abstractions literally, and philosophy proceeds by description and taking ontology as a kind of fiction. (47) Royce's Philosophy of Loyalty follows, which Auxier describes as a "virtue ethics" recognizing the highest ideal of a perfected community, a Kingdom of Ends that is "immanent and operative rather than transcendental and regulative." (49) Though the beloved community is a hypothetical ideal, the living of it makes it concrete as the fulfillment of our finite purposes. This is an example of Royce's absolute pragmatism, that even the most comprehensive ideals are thoroughly practical. Ideals exist only in the temporal mode of the possible; we are compelled to regard as real the larger intelligible structures within which ideals exist, such as the purposive character of Divine will.

Auxier claims that in the final phase of his career Royce consistently followed his method of temporalism and hypothetical ontology. He did not "abandon idealism" in The Problem of Christianity as many interpreters claim. He was never an absolutist in the sense of "giving to philosophical ideas an unconditioned authority over the conduct of life." (50) Rather, Royce identified the temptation to nihilism as a product any high civilization creates for an alienated individuality rather than a peculiar feature of our modern era. Restoring wholeness to individuals is thus possible through an adaptation of Pauline Christianity. (51) Royce continued to teach at Harvard until his death, surely disillusioned by the aggression of Germany, at the early age of 60.

I offer this chapter summary to make a global point about the book's style. Auxier consistently holds together overlaying historical aspects of the production of texts and arguments with a nuanced account of Royce's developing ideas. The result is an intimate account of the various and interlocking features of Royce's philosophy. Principal among the ideas that most clearly distinguish this book is Royce's hypothetical ontology, discovered by Auxier and Dwayne Tunstall, who were surprised that so many had missed it. The idea, worked out in The Religious Aspect of Philosophy, is that all philosophy is a kind of faith based on postulates that can only be cast from the present experience. There is no possibility of certainty of any kind, and so fallibilism is ingredient in his position from the beginning. Also ingredient is the social characteristic of the fictional ontology. Here is an excerpt from a letter to James:

ontology, whereby I mean any positive theory of an external reality as such, is of necessity myth-making; that, however, such ontology may have enough moral worth to make it a proper object of effort so long as people know what they mean by it; that philosophy is reduced to the business of formulating the purposes, the structure and the inner significance of human thought and feeling; that an attempted ontology is good only in so far as it expresses clearly and simply the purposes of thought just as popular mythology is good in so far as it expresses the consciousness of a people; that the ideal of a truth-seeker is not the attainment of any agreement with an external reality, but the attainment of a perfect agreement among all truth-seeking beings; that the ethical philosophy is the highest philosophy. (61)

Contrary to Peirce, who hangs on to a transcendent notion of the Real, Royce insists that there is nothing except the determination of our thoughts and expectations. But in order for a conception of error to obtain with this ontology we must give up the natural postulate of time as a pure succession and adopt a concept of universal and all-inclusive thought against which any finite intention could be viewed in relation to its completeness qua universal. According to Auxier, "giving up upon the all-embracing thought implies giving up all philosophical meaning, for it implies the unreality of every act of intending." (66) The All-Knower, the actual judge "must be there," where this must is not a logical must but a moral must. Auxier concludes by summarizing that for Royce, "We must choose what we shall believe, but the choice is a moral one, for the merely possible God is also an option, one among many." (66) Royce holds this Actual God as necessary to affirm intentionality, error, and meaning. But the risk is that a God in which everything is known as actual eliminates any possibility for effective will or choice. Without possibility ingredient in the Divine it becomes a cold and bloodless abstraction. Royce resolves this with his argument that God considers counter-factuals as possibles from the perspective of each individual. As Auxier articulates it, God considers "what I might have been and might be, but am not." (71)

With regret I pass over the fascinating interplay between Royce, Howison, and Hocking on immediacy and mysticism in order to focus on pragmatism, individuality, persons, and community. Auxier covers a lot of contested ground in his discussion of Royce and pragmatism. In fact, the focus begins on Royce's position of absolute pragmatism before the name was invented. Auxier's four-fold description of pragmatism is 1) commitment to the primacy of experience, 2) philosophical reflection is a kind of critical problem solving activity that takes its impetus from genuine doubt, 3) truth is understood in light of the way it addresses actual problems of genuine doubt in practice, and 4) practice and practical consequences are the measure of philosophy, not vice versa. (103-04) Auxier divides the "radical empiricism" of James and Dewey from the more idealistic pragmatism of Peirce and Royce, and notes that recent analytic philosophers picked up pragmatic ideas but without the deeper knowledge of its historical shape and provenance. This prompts his claim: "No one will read anything written by any analytic philosopher in a hundred years, but people will still read Dewey, James, Peirce, and yes, probably Royce. It is simply better philosophy than anything produced in the second half of the twentieth century." (106)

A part of this "better" is a self-critical understanding of what a genuine philosophical and practical issue is and the relation of these and temperament to philosophical work. To this end Auxier notes that most of what James says about pragmatism flows from Royce's criticisms of him. Engaging in pragmatism entails awareness of responding to criticism, which explains Auxier's effort "to breathe some life into pragmatism by restoring to is [sic] a healthy sense of the place of responsible idealism and personalism in its discussions." (107)

The responsible idealism aspect arises with the prophetic pragmatism Frank Oppenheim identifies in Royce, which is also reflected in Cornel West. Pragmatism's difficulty with immediate experience is in knowing what to do with ideals, because "ideals depend upon possibilities that they think are not immediately given." (109) Ideals unify the ends of practical action as a way of dealing with possibility. Sorting out how feelings become concepts and are generalized into trustworthy forms for warranting philosophical conclusions comprises a "second territory" of pragmatism where proposed solutions that succeed in working can be drawn into structured thought and generalized into other contexts based on issues of value, imagination, vision, and ideals. (112) This leads Auxier to say that Royce is "the best ethicist America has ever produced" when we grasp how he integrated his moral philosophy with a constrained hypothetical ontology and the modal logic of possibility. (115)

Handling such ideals demands metaphysics and logic, which pragmatists are loathe to accept. The phenomenology that Peirce and Royce introduced as extra-philosophical shows its value in the way it is developed by Husserl, Heidegger, and Merleau-Ponty, and is now in the process of reclaiming metaphysics. (119) This contrasts with Putnam and Rorty, who only produce edifying dialogues or an exchange of opinions. Their followers, Auxier opines, would "rather go to hell than learn metaphysics" even with "Rorty's pointy nominalistic trident poking their collective behind." (120) See what I mean about the entertainment value?

Although Auxiuer calls his conclusion about pragmatism a "diatribe" there are more positive than negative parts in the discussion. The True for Peirce and Royce is a social practice as "ideas it endorses in one phase have practical consequences in later phases." (121) True philosophical ideas solve genuine philosophical problems, and that is a practical matter for a philosopher. Auxier denotes the clear statement of ideals as possibilities for human living in the future as "'possibilist' teleology" that excellently handles the reality of ideals as future possibilities. (122)

I turn now to the primary argument for recovering Royce as a personalist that is, in my opinion, the epicenter of the book. Chapter 5 puts forward Royce's idea that God is the "prime cause" of individuality. (128) Thus, understanding reality is the primary aim of philosophical reflection, which is obliged to think about the universe "in terms of its intentional character, because, practically, and therefore metaphysically, the presence of intention or will is an inescapable condition for thinking about anything." (129) For Royce, moral purpose is the condition of meaning, and his "elevation of personality to the highest ethical value, is what marks him as a personalist." (195) Royce says, "We are simply different modes of willing, continuously related to one another and to the total world will which throbs and strives in all of us alike," and "Not otherwise can absolute personality exist than as mediated through the unification of the lives of imperfect and finite personalities." (197)

The following chapter, on Personalism, applies these concepts, particularly to James and his relationship with Borden Parker Bowne and Howison. (203) Although James did not understand Royce, Auxier claims, a critical aspect of James's radical empiricism remains unavailable apart from an understanding of James's personalism, and the most persistent personalist for James was Royce. In Principles of Psychology James considers whether consciousness implies personal modality and concludes, "The only states of consciousness that we naturally deal with are found in personal consciousness, minds, selves, concrete particular I's and you's." (215) In Varieties of Religious Experience James connects a person to the "habitual centre of his personal energy." From these examples Auxier says "person" for James is "the disjunctive process of temporal becoming in which all philosophy is interested," which provides the "form of externality, for it is also the limit of internality -- that which determines what belongs to me and what does not." (219) James's exclusion of institutions as possible persons marks a profound disagreement because "for Royce, communities and institutions are not only higher concrete historical embodiments of purpose, socially directed will, these institutions and communities are in fact 'persons' in a fuller sense than are particular biological individuals." (220) The root of the disagreement is that

James's employment of the term 'individual' more or less interchangeably with 'person' is a conflation that can be corrected, but not without a better metaphysics. . . . James is an 'individualist' only because he has so little idea of what an individual is. . . . His problems are with the whole, and especially attributing, even hypothetically, personhood to any unit larger than the human individual. (222-23)

Where Bowne and James take the personal as a descriptive norm, Royce claims the personal must exist in the sense that it is a universal hypothesis. (225) This leads to Auxier's claim that "not only does radical empiricism require a personalist stance, but also that James himself was well aware of this. . . . Why would we choose to tyrannize our own experience with an impersonal modality , when to do so is among the most unempirical things we can do?" (228) According to his argument radical empiricism requires the priority of social to individual experience. The individual is not an originary given but an achievement or outcome of activity and action, prior to personality. (236) And thus, "For an account of this ideal community in which the source of disjunction is no longer the individual human being, but is still a 'person' and becomes the social mind, or the beloved community, one needs Royce and the superhuman person." (238) Counter to Peirce's "Mind," which moves toward actuality as a crystalline finality, the social infinite of Royce is actual and living. "We want to be more than individual," Auxier writes,

but it does not follow from this that we purpose to be more than personal; rather, the overcoming of that finitude or fragmentariness that is the tragedy of our individuality, of the selection, exclusion and negation of genuine possibilities, overcoming that does not make us more than personal, it makes us more personal . . . individuality is the price we pay for learning our own wills. . . . One of the purposes we choose or will is that the cost of individuality should be less tragic, if we can make it so, that finitude should find redemption, and that we may grow into more personal beings. That is a purpose that a personal being ought to will." (238)

The concluding chapters take up Royce's most important living idea, community. Communities, especially institutions, should be philosophically conceived as communal persons. Community is a way of understanding how a social group can learn its own social will by freely and jointly willing idealized purposes. (251) This follows on the heels of Auxier's account of progress for Royce that depends on communities cultivating individuals into persons who bring critical perspective to the purpose and social will of the community. Martin Luther King, Jr. is an example. In Chapter 9, Auxier focuses on the individual and community relation. "We are obliged," he says, "practically, to treat institutions as persons in order to interpret ourselves." (265) With Royce's notion that "the community is a being that attempts to accomplish something in time through the deeds of its members," (267) the modality of personal existing is more broadly extended than physical life. By existing in a particular meaningful, interpretable way, just this way and not some other, individuals act so as to own a part of our community's memory and to accomplish some portion of its hopes and expectations. Communities remember, hope and act, and this temporal triad is the definition of a real person for Royce.

Auxier returns to a passage he has cited several times from The Problem of Christianity that is the "master key" of Royce's thought because it contains hypothetical ontology and ethical first philosophy grounded in the experience of community. Royce says a loved community

may be the object of such active disposition to love and to serve the community as an unit, to treat the community as if it were a sort of super-personal being, and as if it could, in its turn, possess the value of a person on some higher level. One who thus loves a community, regards its type of life, its form of being, as essentially more worthy than his own. He becomes devoted to its interest as to something that by its very nature is nobler than himself. In such a case he may find, in his devotion to his community, his fulfillment and his moral destiny " (269)

Auxier points out the order -- not that we simply love our communities and so render them persons; "rather, we are first loved by our communities and learn, in time, through making them the exclusive object of our interest, to return the gift . . . we are individuated before we individuate." (270)

Progress, as I pointed out above, depends on communities making the strongest persons. But in order to become such a person one has to endure a betrayal of one's own best purposes, what Royce calls "original sin." Such a break between a community person and the individual person occurs because together they are unstable. The Prodigal Son leaves an excellent "person," a fine institution, before a return is possible. The separation is necessary for the act of transforming the love of a community purpose into love of the world purpose. (279) This atonement is not possible without owning the betrayal. (282) Aiming at the formation of persons requires enduring the separation of "original sin" on the part of the individual person and the communal person. But a community can be disordered if it fails to credit the value of the possible experience of others. Auxier describes this as the sociopathic tendency of holding ungrounded abstractions above concrete experiences. An example is profit driven corporations that are often criminally defective communities. Granting them political influence, he says, is like arming an insane person. (272) Similar violence of elevating abstractions over the possible experience of others is apparent in the individual thought of Hitler, Richard Dawkins, E. O. Wilson, and Daniel Dennett, "little fascists of the intellect," who aim to cleanse whatever strikes them as impure. (272) Auxier asks, "Is an ideal purpose possible in their world as 'real,' that is having a past, present, and future?" (273) We treat institutions as persons because they treat us as persons before we actually attain any significant individuality and form plans that can become purposes in the community setting. (274) Auxier concludes, "commercial institutions more often destroy our personhood instead of teaching us the true meaning of finding a calling in life to serve." (275)

Auxier concludes with an application of sorts of Royce's community to the current state of professional philosophy. In his most confessional statement, Auxier writes,

I do wish to understand why I cannot now, in good conscience, serve the APA as a cause befitting a morally developed human being, and why so many of our institutions have gone the same way . . . continuing service to any community as something beloved by its servants depends upon addressing and redressing what goes wrong. (319)

This echoes Royce's observation that "The philosophers differ sadly amongst themselves . . . [and] are thus far individuals rather than consciously members of one another. The charity of mutual interpretation is ill developed amongst them." (314-15) Auxier points to J. E. Creighton as the single individual most important for establishing "the form and expectations of the modern 'profession' of philosophy." (325) Cornell President Jacob Gould Schurman and Creighton formed the Sage School of Philosophy, including colloquia, history of philosophy, formal papers, and debates in the 1890s, which set the pattern for almost every American graduate school of philosophy today. (327) Creighton became editor-in-chief of Philosophical Review, which published the proceedings of the APA when it first formed, and he was also the American editor of Kant-Studien, becoming a gatekeeper for sending the material for publication. Although there were other journals and other styles of graduate philosophy education, the Philosophical Review and the Cornell style came to define the profession.

In 1901, at the founding of the APA, Creighton's first presidential address decries the failed "incidental activities" of attempting a history of American philosophy and International Co-operation, and says that "the main thing, of course, that concerns us . . . is the work proper of the Association as exhibited in the papers read and discussed at our meetings." (336) He adds, "promotion of philosophical scholarship and research is the only object capable of affording a purpose common to all the members of the association, and an interest which is likely to be serious and lasting." (337) And this entails limiting the time stealing busy-work of teaching. (341) Auxier challenges the sanity of the APA based on the experience that "we decided not how to become good philosophers, but how to play a sociopathic game of self-advancement." (343) "One thing that has been lost in professionalized philosophy," Auxier writes, "is the sense that it exists to enhance the experience of those who take the trouble to listen, to read, to learn to speak and think according to its patterns of order." (344) Personal moral development and the development of vital communities is the way to serve philosophy, where one focuses on "training for loyalty" in the teaching of philosophy.

The last word then is loyalty, love of the individual for the community. Royce places this at the heart of the virtues,

not only at the summit of the mountain human spirits must climb if man is really to be saved, but also (where it equally belongs) at the turning point of human history . . . when that homeland of the human spirit 'which eager hearts expect' was first introduced as a vision, as a hope, as a conscious longing to mankind. I want to show what loyalty is and all that is true of the loyal spirit. (346)

For Royce this is love, agape, adopted from Christian tradition as the one that really made this idea of loyalty immanent in history. Auxier muses, "Can I adopt this toward the APA? No." But he can to philosophy that opens up the student's "world of truth." A person who chooses philosophy, he says, "chooses to serve what is Good and what is Beautiful through his or her service to the Truth." (348)

Evaluating this complex book, including the interplay between Auxier's own interest in advocating pluralism both as an historical figure and as a contemporary option for philosophers, pragmatists and otherwise, is quite a delightful challenge. What I find most impressive is the reconstruction of the arguments elemental to the formation of American philosophy and the orientation this provides to current issues and debates. Auxier succeeds in highlighting Royce's relevance for establishing a more balanced understanding of pragmatism at its roots, and in indicating the power of analysis sponsored by Royce's "living ideas." This is indeed a text loyal to Royce and to the philosophical community in which he lived and continues to live. It is also loyal to the demand of philosophy as a self-critical enterprise of both professing Truth and discovering Truth. The book demonstrates Auxier's deep and broad understanding of philosophy that spans continents, ages, and styles. It suggests many openings for further inquiry, further questions, and interesting development -- too many to even list in shorthand. Finally, what I think this book represents is the task of philosophers interpreting philosophy to themselves, but with an eye toward the social and cultural implications of interpretation. We cannot really know what we do without considering the ways our thought and its patters have developed from the social and cultural forces around us, and the effects our thinking -- yes, even the papers we read to each other at conferences -- has for the larger community. Auxier clearly opens this window of interpretation (with all his idiosyncrasies), and it is to our benefit, I believe, for all of us to consider the view.